Honor for Us: A Philosophical Analysis, Interpretation and Defense

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William Lad Sessions, Honor for Us: A Philosophical Analysis, Interpretation and Defense, Continuum, 2010, 210pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441188342.

Reviewed by Terrance McConnell, The University of North Carolina at Greensboro


In the "Preface" of Honor for Us, William Lad Sessions says that contemporary philosophers have ignored the idea of honor and related topics. He writes, "Honor doesn't seem to fit into any current philosophical circle of conversation" (x). When those words were written, the claim was no doubt true. But the same year that Sessions published his book, Kwame Anthony Appiah published The Honor Code (W.W. Norton & Company, 2010). This happenstance may confirm Sessions' assertion that an investigation of this topic is long overdue.

Honor for Us is divided into three parts. Part I, entitled "Concepts of Honor," distinguishes six different concepts of honor (Chapter 2), develops a detailed account of what is called "personal honor" (Chapter 3), distinguishes this from morality and religion (Chapter 4), and discusses what are called "deviant" forms of honor (Chapter 5). Part II explores contemporary practices that Sessions says can be better understood if we see them in the context of personal honor. These include war and warriors (Chapter 6), sports (Chapter 7), the patriotism of citizens (Chapter 8), the contemporary academy (Chapter 9), and some of the professions, especially law (Chapter 10). Part III, "Honor's Future," includes a response to many different objections that have been raised against honor (Chapter 11) and an exploration of the relevance and value of honor to all of us today (Chapter 12).

When a term like 'honor' has multiple instantiations, we might wonder whether there is some underlying unity in all of them. Sessions delineates three possibilities here (8): the category may be univocal, suggesting Platonic essentialism; there may be commonality without shared essence, suggesting Wittgenstein's family resemblance; or the concepts may share the same name only by equivocation. Though Sessions is not explicit about this, it seems that he rejects essentialism but allows that at least some of the six concepts of honor have commonality.

'Honor' is sometimes used as a verb. This seems to be the case with what Sessions calls conferred honor (11-14). This is given by someone, the honorer, to someone else, the honoree, based on qualities that the former values and believes that the latter exemplifies. Conferred honor is not owed; it is a gift. Sessions does not provide many examples of the first five instances of honor, but perhaps a civic organization declaring a member of the community as "person of the year" is a prototypical case of conferred honor. Recognition honor (14-17) is not merely gratuitous, but is owed to the honoree. This involves public acknowledgement of excellences that have a more or less objective basis. Perhaps students who have achieved a certain score on a standardized examination of great difficulty exemplify this notion. Here the honor (a noun) was won. Positional honor (17-20) is a matter of being, having, or doing something that places one "above" others. Positional honor may be based on achievement (say, the world's fastest human as measured by the 100 meter dash) or on status (say, the Queen of England in virtue of birth).Commitment honor (20-21) is a matter of fulfilling promises and agreements. Attributing commitment honor to a person implies a consistent pattern of behavior with respect to agreements. Honor in what I think is the most attenuated sense is called trust honor (22-25). This is attributed to someone who we are confident acts reliably, according to principle.

The key concept is personal honor (Chapter 3). Sessions says that it "differs significantly from the five peripheral concepts, though it incorporates several of them" (26). No clean definition of 'personal honor' is provided, possibly because Sessions doubts that necessary and sufficient conditions can be given. Various features associated with personal honor are noted, though unfortunately the term 'honor' is often used in the explanation. Readers are told that personal honor involves "having an effective sense of honor" (26). It is a Janus concept, looking both inward and outward (e.g., 26, 29, 53, 156, 173). The inward component concerns a condition of the agent, a character trait. The outward component refers to the individual's conduct which can be observed by others; "it means adhering firmly to the honor code of some honor group and being loyal to its members" (26). An honor code consists of prohibitions, requirements, ideals, instructions for dealing with code-breakers, and precepts for re-admission to the group (27-28). Sessions says that "personal honor is intelligible only in terms of a certain social backdrop; . . . belonging to a certain kind of social group, the honor group" (29; see also, 122, 158). A genuine honor code must be such that (i) it is other-regarding (prescribing duties to others), (ii) it makes each member responsible for the maintenance of honor, (iii) on occasions it requires that self-interest give way to principle, and (iv) it generates ideals as well as requirements and prohibitions (54-55, 158). Since personal honor requires belonging to a certain kind of group, size matters (e.g., 34-35, 92, 94, 108-109). Because trust and loyalty among members is important and because each holds all accountable, honor groups flourish only when they are small enough to allow each to know all others.

Honor's "extent" or "its jurisdiction" (180) warrants special mention. Though there is some leeway, honor codes tend "to expand to the point where just about everything one does is within honor's purview" (180). Such codes are onerous. This creates an obvious problem of conflicting norms for anyone who is a member of more than one honor group (50) and may be especially problematic if patriotism is viewed as an honor group (108-109). This feature, when combined with the importance of size (small being better), creates obvious difficulties in trying to construe sports, patriotism, academic research, and the legal profession as honor groups. In contemporary society all of these entities are quite large and members of them are likely part of multiple groups. Sessions is acutely aware of these difficulties, but his responses to them are sometimes strained.

Though personal honor is largely "within an individual's control," still "it may be challenged, diminished, and even lost" by the actions of others. In particular, insult and offense are threats to one's honor that must be answered (31-32). Personal honor commands both self-respect and the respect of others (e.g., 30, 38, 183), and insults and offenses violate these. In the context of patriotism, this prompts Sessions to say that "disrespect of one's country often prompts violent patriotic reaction" (103-104). There is an oddity here. Sessions goes to great lengths (164-168) to show that violence is only connected with honor contingently; yet he seems to portray violence as the natural way to respond to insult or offense. A different solution is indicated by his own words: "True personal honor, in other words, can only be among equals" (169). This suggests what seems plausible to me: that meaningful insults and offenses also can only come from equals. Imagine that a group of religious zealots denigrate the work of an evolutionary biologist. Amusement is a completely proper response on her part. But if fellow researchers challenge her work with insult or offense, an answer is required (though not violence). Calling an accusation an insult or offense suggests that it packs a certain punch; but it can do so only if the individual accused has some regard for the accuser. Sessions agrees: "we want to be well regarded by those we regard highly" (104). Nor is it easy to see why a violent response is either relevant or sufficient. Sessions does suggest alternatives to violence, such as "shunning or ostracism" (167). But even these seem over the top in many cases. Suppose a warrior is called a coward by an equal, a fellow honor group member or a respected outsider. Fighting that individual, regardless of the outcome, does not answer the charge; the issue, instead, is how that particular warrior behaved in a specific context, or what his pattern of behavior has been. So when somebody makes derogatory comments about one's country to a patriot, often those comments will lack the punch needed to merit any response, let alone a fighting response.

According to Sessions, personal honor is a virtue (e.g., 34, 37, 181), but not a moral virtue. This is because personal honor is not the same as, and may deviate from, morality (e.g., 37, 38, 76-77, 89, 152, 162). A warrior's honor code or the code of a defense attorney may require actions that conflict with morality. The code associated with a particular sport may require actions that are morally indifferent. Two examples illustrate nicely the plausibility of Sessions' claim that personal honor is separate from morality. At the outset of Hitler's Willing Executioners, Daniel Jonah Goldhagen discusses the case of Captain Wolfgang Hoffmann. Hoffmann was the commander of one of the companies of Police Battalion 101 and was also a zealous executioner of Jews. Hoffmann, however, disobeyed a superior's order that he sign a pledge that he and his men would not engage in stealing or plundering. He viewed such a request as an insult; he and his men adhered to "German norms of morality." Hoffmann said, "[I] am not able to carry out the order, since I feel injured in my sense of honor."[1] A second example is found in fiction, namely, in "The Just Assassins," a play by Albert Camus.[2] In this play, a group of revolutionaries are committed to killing the Grand Duke. One opportunity for bombing his carriage was missed, however, because there were children aboard. Toward the end of Act II, several of the revolutionaries debate whether killing children, if necessary to hit the main target, is honorable. This not only illustrates the separation of honor from morality, but also demonstrates Sessions' contention that honor codes are not always specific and require interpretation (26-29, 70-72).

The separation of personal honor from morality cannot be good for honor, the reader might think. Yet Sessions' book is a plea for taking honor more seriously. Not surprisingly, then, Sessions argues that honor adds something to morality. He puts it this way: "As a set of universally binding and overriding principles, morality is rather abstract and general, lacking in motive power" (40). This deficit is filled by honor. "What moral honor adds to morality are social embeddedness, concrete power of motivation, possibly a sense of individual identity, and even a meaningful life" (40; see also 161). Moreover, Sessions maintains that personal honor is distinctive among normative concepts (173). In order to justify this claim, Sessions argues that personal honor is not reducible to honesty, integrity, or civility (187-189). On the positive side, Sessions says, "Personal honor is distinctive in the premium it places on commitment to principle (the honor code), loyalty to others (members of the honor group), and the kind of concern it has for the regard of those honorable others" (189). These claims about what morality lacks (and honor possesses) seem to me overblown. Whether morality is necessarily motivating is the age-old question debated by internalists and externalists; in this context, it does not seem warranted to assume that the former are mistaken. Being connected to a group and having a sense of identity are important goods promoted by membership in honor groups. But it does not seem that honor groups alone promote these ends. Paying special attention to some others -- showing partiality -- does sometimes seem admirable. But the assumption that abstract morality cannot license such conduct is not justified.[3]

My own view is that integrity is an important moral virtue and that it captures what is valuable about honor. But Sessions unequivocally rejects this position. He writes: "Such personal honor is more than mere integrity, self-consistency, commitment or responsibility" (26; see also, 34, 56, 137, 187). Why does honor go beyond "mere integrity"? The answer seems to be this: "At the heart of personal honor are two virtues, I will call trustworthiness and loyalty" (34). Personal honor involves commitment to a subset of persons, members of one's honor group. The view inHonor for Us is that there is a value in this connectedness with others, even when a group's honor code is incompatible with morality. Sessions explains that moral personal honor can be achieved within a group in either of two ways. One of these ways "is where morality is embedded inside the honor code" (39). Here moral precepts are contained within the honor code and they "dominate non-moral" prescriptions. The other way to understand moral honor is this: "morality lies outside the honor code but constrains or overrides" the code whenever there is a conflict with morality (39). Sessions acknowledges that the good of honor does not necessarily outweigh all other goods (186) and says at the end of the book that we would like to know "how honor fits into the good life, a life that is good, all things considered, for the person who lives it" (190). Part of the answer should be that honor must be constrained by morality. This is not unlike the familiar point made by Kant at the outset of the Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals. While noting that traits like intelligence, wit, courage, and perseverance are valuable, Kant adds, "but they can also become extremely bad and harmful if the will, which is to make use of these gifts of nature and which in its special constitution is called character, is not good."[4]

If you are like me, you regard honor as a quaint idea to which you have given little thought. Sessions' book, which is engaging, stimulating, and well written, will force you to think about the topic in different ways. And while I am not inclined to think that various sports, academic research, or the legal profession are fruitfully viewed as honor societies, thinking about them in this way does prompt a deeper understanding of what honor is.

[1] Daniel Jonah Goldhagen, Hitler's Willing Executioners (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1996), pp. 3-4.

[2] Albert Camus, Caligula and Three Other Plays (New York: Vintage Books, 1958), translated by Stuart Gilbert.

[3] For an extended argument that utilitarianism can sanction special obligations, see Henry Sidgwick, The Methods of Ethics (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, seventh edition, 1981/1907), pp. 252-253, 382, and 432-436.

[4] Immanuel Kant, Grounding for the Metaphysics of Morals (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 1981/1785), translated by James Ellington, p. 7.