How Ficta Follow Fiction: A Syncretistic Account of Fictional Entities

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Alberto Voltolini, How Ficta Follow Fiction: A Syncretistic Account of Fictional Entities, Springer, 2006, 273pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781402051463.

Reviewed by Anthony Everett, Bristol University


This is an absolutely excellent book and should be required reading for anyone interested in fictional objects, fiction, or fictionalist accounts of some domain of discourse.  In it Voltolini argues for, and rigorously develops, a highly sophisticated and nuanced realist account of fictional entities, such as the fictional character Sherlock Holmes, on which such entities genuinely exist and are abstract objects.  Voltolini's book sets a new benchmark for clarity and care.  His account of fictional entities is certainly the most detailed and well thought-through brand of realism about these entities.  And he offers a detailed discussion of, and powerful collection of arguments against, all the major alternative positions.  As such Voltolini's is the account that other fictional realists and fictional anti-realists must refute or better.

I would emphasize that, although the topic of fictional objects may itself seem rather narrow, the proper treatment of fictional entities, and Voltolini's book in particular, is potentially of considerable philosophical importance since fictionalist accounts of various ontologically problematic domains are currently fashionable.  Such accounts purport to free us from the undesirable ontology that seems to come with the discourse about that domain by construing that discourse as simply a fiction and the ontologically undesirable objects as merely fictional entities.  Precisely how much comfort such a move brings, however, will depend upon the ultimate nature of fictional entities and upon what we found objectionable about the ontologically problematic domain to which we seemed committed.  Suppose, for example, we want to go fictionalist about mathematical entities because we want to free our ontology from abstract objects.  Then should it turn out that fictional entities are themselves abstract objects (as they are on Voltolini's account) clearly we will not have made any ontological progress.

I have high praise for Voltolini's account.  But in the end I think his account is completely mistaken.  In what follows I will sketch the structure of Voltolini's book and outline his own "syncretistic" account of fictional entities before offering some criticisms of that account.  Voltolini's book is full of arguments, all of which are interesting and some of which are very good indeed, and his own position is complex and nuanced.  So I cannot hope to do full justice to Voltolini here.  But I hope that what I have to say will give a flavor of the book and encourage others to read it for themselves.

Voltolini's syncretistic account may be seen as combining elements from Neo-Meinongian accounts of fictional entities (such as those of Parsons and Zalta) and accounts which treat fictional entities as abstract artifacts (such as that of Thomasson).  Accordingly the first two chapters carefully set out, elaborate, and criticize, a number of different versions of these theories.  Voltolini argues that the identity criteria for fictional entities proposed by Neo-Meinongian accounts, on which a and b count as the same fictional object just in case the fiction ascribes to them exactly the same properties, provide only necessary but not sufficient conditions for identity.  In particular, Voltolini considers a variant of Borges' story Pierre Menard, Author of the Quixote, in which Menard writes a word-for-word duplicate of Cervantes's novel Don Quixote, even though he had absolutely no knowledge of, or interaction with, Cervantes or Cervantes's novel.  Since both Cervantes's novel and Menard's novel ascribe exactly the same properties to their heroes the Neo-Meinongian seems forced to identify Cervantes's Quixote-character and Menard's Quixote-character.  But, Voltolini argues, this is intuitively unacceptable.  Since there is no interaction between Cervantes and Menard we must take them to create two different fictional characters.  And so much the worse for the Neo-Meinongian.  Voltolini also argues that Thomasson's account faces a number of problems, including the fact that it cannot provide an adequate sense in which fictional entities might count as artifacts and the fact that it does not provide sufficient conditions for the existence of a fictional entity.

Voltolini himself takes fictional entities to be composite entities.  A fictional character (for example) will comprise a set of properties and a make-believe process-type.  The properties in question will be those corresponding to the set of properties mobilized in the story-telling process and attributed by the story to the relevant individual.  And the make-believe process-type will be that which is instantiated by the relevant portions of the story-telling process.  The fictional entity is brought into existence by the first instance where the relevant make-believe process-type mobilizes the properties corresponding to those in the relevant property set.  In this way we can provide identity conditions for fictional entities: a and b are identical just in case they share the same property set and make-believe process-type.  And we can also provide existence conditions for a fictional entity: in order for a to exist an instance of its constituent process-type must have mobilized the properties corresponding to those in its constituent property set.  Thus, in so far as we take Cervantes and Menard to be employing instances of two distinct though qualitatively identical make-believe process types, we can distinguish the characters they create (p. 82).  And we can capture some of Thomasson's intuitions in so far as we see fictional entities as coming into being as the result of human practices (p. 86).

Voltolini goes on to elaborate the syncretistic theory.  He offers a powerful barrage of criticisms against anti-realist accounts, including, in particular, pretence-theoretic accounts inspired by Walton and Evans.  And he offers a very interesting ontological argument for the existence of fictional entities to the effect that we have to accept their existence because they figure in the identity conditions of fictional works, whose existence we already accept.

It seems to me that, despite the strength of Voltolini's arguments, both Thomasson and the pretence-theorist may block some of their force.  Thus, for example, I suspect Thomasson might respond to the charge that she cannot provide an adequate sense in which fictional entities count as artifacts along the following lines.  She might note that fictional entities come into being and have the properties they do as the result of human activities and that those who undertake these activities at least implicitly recognize this and they purposefully shape their activities in order to bestow a desired set of properties upon the entities they create.  This seems sufficient to make fictional objects at least very artifact-like.

This is obviously not the place for a full discussion of these issues.  Rather I want to argue that the syncretistic account is itself subject to a number of criticisms and to briefly sketch four of these.  Broadly speaking we might raise two sorts of objections to the syncretistic account.  We might accept that syncretistic objects exist but deny that they should be identified with fictional entities.  Or we might deny that syncretistic objects themselves exist.  My first three objections fall into the first category and my last into the second category.

Firstly, as Voltolini himself admits, since the syncretistic account takes fictional objects to be essentially constituted by a property set and make-believe process-type it makes fictional objects terribly fragile.  If Jane Austin had attributed one more or one less property to the character she called "Emma" her storytelling would have mobilized a different property set and we would have ended up with a distinct fictional character (pp. 95-6).  And if her story-telling process had deviated slightly from its actual course, say by her explicitly stating certain implicit truths about her heroine, or by her stating the same truths but in a different order, she would have instantiated a different make-believe process-type and hence would have created a different character.  This seems highly counter-intuitive.  For surely, we might suppose, Austin's Emma would still be the same character in those circumstances.  Note moreover that on the syncretistic account the later Holmes stories, which attribute new properties to their hero which the first one did not, will generate a series of new fictional characters all distinct from the character generated by the first novel (p. 110).

Voltolini recognizes the counter-intuitive nature of these results and to a certain extent tries to accommodate some of our intuitions.  But he also argues that our intuitions about fictional objects are often unclear or conflicting and that we may sometimes need to give up what seem to be intuitively obvious claims about fictional objects if they conflict with a good, but revisionary, theory of these (p. 80).  I certainly agree that our intuitions are often a poor guide to reality.  Perhaps, for example, our intuitions about a property or kind are driven by the prototype we associate with that property or kind, a prototype which reveals nothing about the property or kind's essential nature or about its extension. Thus, consider our tiger-concept and our water-concept.  And let us suppose that the extensions of these concepts are determined externally, by the causal relations which hold between cognizers and the world.  It might then be that our tiger and water prototypes, and the intuitions they generate, are highly misleading.  They might not properly capture the extension or reveal the essences of tigers and water.  So intuitions about the identity conditions of tigers or water samples, in ofar as they are driven by the associated prototypes, might be subject to potential revision.

Nevertheless, in the present case I disagree with Voltolini.  For one thing, it is unclear what could fix the things which fall within the extension of our concept of a fictional object if it is not our beliefs about these things.  There are not external causal relations between cognizers and syncretistic objects that determine that our concept of a fictional object picks out the class of syncretistic objects despite the mismatch between these objects and our beliefs about them.  For another, note that in the course of arguing against alternative accounts and motivating his own, Voltolini himself frequently appeals to our intuitions about fictional objects, and in particular our intuitions about their identity conditions.  Recall, for example, his argument against Neo-Meinongianism that appeals to the intuition that the characters created by Cervantes and Menard are distinct.  I would have thought that the intuition that Austin might have attributed slightly different properties to Emma without creating a new fictional character is far stronger and more robust than our intuition that Cervantes and Menard create different characters.  So if our intuitions really are defeasible in the way Voltolini suggests it is not clear how much force his Menard-argument can have.

This brings us to my second objection to Voltolini, the issue of how it is that terms referring to fictional objects, such as the term "Holmes," come to refer to syncretistic objects.  Voltolini suggests that the reference of such terms is fixed by description (p. 198).  Thus the term "Holmes" refers to a particular syncretistic object in virtue of our fixing its reference via a description of the form "the result of seeing the set of properties {P, Q, R, …} as make-believedlyn such that the properties corresponding to those properties are instantiated by an individual."  But surely this is wildly implausible.  It seems most unlikely that any literary theorist who talks of the fictional character Holmes could be credited with even implicitly associating this complex and technical description with the name "Holmes."  Indeed I suspect the ordinary theorist is very unlikely to associate a determinate set of properties or a determinate make-believe process with Holmes at all, let alone mobilize these to fix the reference of "Holmes."

My third objection to the syncretistic account is this.  As with most brands of fictional realism, Voltolini holds that fictional objects genuinely exist, and he must therefore explain away the apparent truth of such negative existentials as:

(1) Holmes does not exist.

Like many other fictional realists, Voltolini tries to explain the truth of (1) by treating it as a disguised case of existential quantification:

(2) ~(x)(x=Holmes),

and arguing that, while (2) is false if the quantifier ranges over the domain of everything there is, we typically read the quantifier in (2) as ranging over a restricted domain consisting only of spatiotemporal individuals (pp. 218-9).  But this suggestion is highly problematic for a number of reasons.  As Walton and I have argued elsewhere, there are technical reasons to doubt that (1) can be understood as (2).  Moreover if we can use (1) to make the true claim that the fictional character of Holmes is distinct from any spatiotemporal object, surely a mathematical realist could use:

(3) The number one does not exist,

to make the true claim that the number one is distinct from any spatiotemporal object.  Given that, presumably, mathematical realists will deny there is any natural reading of (3) on which it comes out as true, it looks as if Voltolini's treatment of (1) must therefore be wrong.

I have argued that syncretistic objects are unsuitable candidates for being fictional objects since syncretistic objects seem to have different identity conditions from fictional objects, since it is unclear how those who refer to fictional objects might come to refer to syncretistic objects, and since syncretistic objects exist.  I want to conclude by raising a worry about the existence of syncretistic objects themselves.  Voltolini is clear that a syncretistic object is not to be identified with the mereological sum of its associated property set and process-type.  For, plausibly, since the property set and process-type are abstract entities which exist eternally, so will their sum, while fictional beings come into existence as the result of our story-telling practices (pp. 87-8).  Rather the process of storytelling induces a relation between the property set and process-type -- that of our 'mobilizing' the relevant properties by instantiating the process -- which somehow binds the property set and process-type into an object.  But one might very well worry how our mobilizing a set of properties in a make-believe process could generate a new compound object.  Presumably not every relation that holds between two abstract objects can generate a special sort of compound out of them which holds in virtue of their standing in that relation.  So how does the 'mobilizing' relation manage to achieve this?  I don't mean to claim that no sense can be made of this idea.  But in the absence of a great deal of further defense and elaboration I am deeply skeptical as to whether our universe contains syncretistic objects.

I have raised a series of objections to Voltolini's syncretistic account and raised some reservations about the arguments he offers against rival views.  As I said, in the end I think the syncretistic account is badly wrong.  But I also hope that I have conveyed my great enthusiasm for the book and done justice to its many very fine qualities.  It is a paradigm of excellent philosophy and it sets a new benchmark in the discussion of fictional objects.  I recommend it to anyone interested in these issues, or simply interested in good analytic philosophy, with absolutely no hesitation.