How Hume and Kant Reconstruct Natural Law: Justifying Strict Objectivity without Debating Moral Realism

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Kenneth R. Westphal, How Hume and Kant Reconstruct Natural Law: Justifying Strict Objectivity without Debating Moral Realism, Oxford University Press, 2016, 252pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198747055.

Reviewed by Richard McCarty, East Carolina University


In this forcefully argued contribution to the theory of justice, Kenneth R. Westphal looks back to Hume and Kant as reformers of an earlier "natural law" tradition. Each is said to have developed a method of justifying principles of justice, called "natural law constructivism," that remains "neutral about moral realism, about the contrast between 'consequentialism' and 'deontology', about the putative value of human agency, and about intrinsic or extrinsic links between reasons and motives" (3-4). This is history of philosophy done right, telling us what people thought some centuries ago, and why we should think the same. It is the admirable work of a mature thinker who is passionate about justifying principles of justice, and about why their justification matters.

Natural law constructivism promises moral objectivity (non-arbitrariness) without a metaphysics of morals, and without natural teleology. It aims to fulfill that promise through a method of constructing moral principles from uncontroversial natural conditions. "The key to providing objectivity with a constructivist moral theory is . . . to appeal to objective facts about our form of finite rational agency and circumstances of action which are basic to the human condition" (21). Constructivism as a general philosophical method can be traced to a four-fold procedure articulated by Carnap: (1) identify a domain of basic elements; (2) identify and sort those elements; (3) use the most salient and prevalent among them to construct satisfactory principles, by using (4) preferred principles of construction (19). Natural law constructivism is so called because it arises from the pre-modern tradition of recognizing the most salient and relevant elements of the moral domain in divinely legislated laws of nature. In more modern times, thinkers like Hume and Kant recognized those elements in laws of human nature, while remaining agnostic about their provenance. Hence: natural law morality sans metaphysics and teleology.

The heart of this book is a presentation of Kant's natural law constructivism, particularly as developed by Onora O'Neill. Not all interpretations of Kant's ethics are constructivist and, among constructivist interpretations, not all are natural law constructivist. "Kant's method for identifying and justifying basic moral principles is constructivist," writes Westphal, "because it makes no appeal to any antecedent source or kind of normative authority", i.e., it invokes no pre-given moral reality, nor any overarching value, such as humanity, freedom, or autonomy. The justificatory strategy of Kant's natural law constructivism

appeals only to a fundamental principle of rational justification as such (in non-formal domains), that justifying a principle, policy, belief, institution, or action requires that its proponent can provide sufficient justifying reasons to all other concerned parties, such that these parties can consistently adopt or follow the very same proposal and its justifying reasons in thought or action. (97)

This justificatory strategy is said to be codified in the famous "universalization test" of Kant's ethics: act only maxims that you can will to become universal law. A key assumption in the overall argument of the book is "justificatory externalism": that sufficient justification can be provided to someone independently of his or her prior commitments or motivational set (6). On this assumption, moral justification need not appeal to other concerned parties' consent, actual or hypothetical. It therefore need not be construed as fundamentally contractual justification, such as envisioned by Rawls's Kantian constructivism, based on the idea of a "realm of ends."

Westphal presents Hume as having inaugurated natural law constructivism, in Bk. III of A Treatise of Human Nature. But he makes no mention of the earlier natural lawyer, Samuel Pufendorf (1632-94), who expressed a constructivist strategy some sixty years prior, in his theory of moral entities. Persons are among the moral entities recognized by Pufendorf, as are moral powers, rights, and obligations. "You may justly call the Great and Good God their maker . . . Nevertheless, the majority of [the moral entities] have been superadded later at the pleasure of men themselves, according as they felt that the introduction of them would help to develop the life of man and reduce it to order" (The Law of Nature and of Nations [1672], Bk. I, Ch. I, §3). Pufendorf's reply to anyone skeptical of the objectivity of humanly constructed moral entities was, "the very condition of man demanded the institution of them, a condition assigned him by the most Good and Great Creator out of his goodness and wisdom; hence such entities can by no means be uncertain and weak" (Ch. II, §5). In a similar vein, Hume would write that "Though the rules of justice be artificial, they are not arbitrary. Nor is the expression improper to call them laws of nature; if by natural we understand what is common to any species, or even if we confine it to mean what is inseparable from the species" (T

The set of natural facts grounding Hume's construction of the principles of justice is said to include "physiological and geographical facts about the vital needs of human beings, . . . the relative scarcity of materials required for us to meet our vital needs, and our ineluctable mutual interdependence" (22). These facts leave human beings with a set of "social-coordination problems," each of which Hume's theory of justice is constructed in order to solve. The first of these problems, and the only one that can be mentioned here, is how to stabilize possession of the means required for meeting vital human needs. Its solution is the construction of property and the wider convention of justice; but not on an ultimately arbitrary, contractualist basis, such as provided by Hobbes, or more recently by Gauthier, who is criticized in Chapter 7. "This convention [of justice] is not of the nature of a promise," wrote Hume, "For even promises themselves . . . arise from human conventions" (T In his subsequent illustration: "Two men, who pull the oars of a boat, do it by an agreement or convention, tho' they have never given promises to each other."

Westphal is impressed by Hume's constructivist project, but soon dismisses it with the charge that his genetic theory of justice refutes his wider moral sentimentalism. In the wider theory, moral judgments depend crucially upon feelings about agents' motives. But it is alleged to have escaped his notice that whether actions are just or unjust has nothing to do with sentiments or motives. "Hume's theory of justice suffices . . . to identify certain acts as right, and others as wrong, and to justify these classifications, without any appeal to sentiments, whether moral or non-moral" (40). I find this charge of self-refutation grossly unfair, insofar as it overlooks Hume's intention to provide a virtue theory of morality, including justice. But I will let Hume scholars argue the point. The sweeping conclusion drawn from the leading discussion of Hume is that sentimentalist moral theories fail to justify the principles of justice normatively (54). The same goes for all emotivisms and projectionisms, and in short, for all moral empiricisms.

Kant emerges next in the historical narrative to purge natural law constructivism of any empiricist commitments, but not through any critical metaphysics of morals. Westphal rejects Kant's transcendental idealism. As he sees it, the Kantian universalization test is all that is required for normatively justifying moral principles based upon the natural facts of human existence and agency.

Ruling out maxims which fail to pass Kant's universalization test establishes the minimum necessary conditions for resolving the fundamental problems of conflict and social coordination which generated the central concern of Modern natural law theories with establishing normative standards to govern public life domestically and internationally, despite deep disagreements among various groups about the substance of a good or a pious life. (88)

The categorical imperative is the most well-known of the universalization tests. But the later-expressed Universal Principle of Right (Justice) is important also: "Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone's freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone's freedom in accordance with a universal law" (The Metaphysics of Morals, 6:230). Westphal takes this principle as primary in Kantian ethics, writing that "What is objectively right and wrong is specified by the moral law; the most fundamental criterion for specifying the moral law is Kant's Universal Principle of Justice" (78). Although this is not the usual presentation of the structure of Kant's moral philosophy, its expression may serve to enliven the recent debate over the relation between the categorical imperative and the Universal Principle of Justice.

Erecting natural law constructivism on the cornerstone of the Kantian universalization test will strike most readers as quixotic. Even some of Kant's more sympathetic interpreters, constructivist and non-constructivist alike, have turned their backs on that test owing to its vulnerability to so many types of counterexamples. Undaunted, Westphal offers a simple fix, in the form of a double-testing algorithm. It is, in summary: if a maxim fails the universalization test, then so acting is morally wrong, unless the maxim's negation fails also, in which case acting on either is morally permissible. For example, take the following maxim. "Whenever I reach a door at the same time as another, I shall always pass through second" (83). This innocent maxim fails the universalization test. However, because its negation also fails -- or so it is claimed -- it is vindicated by double-testing. But Westphal offers no hint why a maxim's failure together with its negation should signify moral permissibility; nor does he provide any guidance for formulating the "negation" of failed maxims for testing. If the negation of the example maxim is ". . . I shall not always pass through second" (contradictory), then it will not be vindicated by double testing, because that negative formulation passes the test. The preferred negation is evidently, ". . . I shall always pass through first" (contrary). Yet preference for testing failed maxims' contraries seems arbitrary. Moreover, if the pass-through-second maxim can be vindicated by double testing, then wouldn't the following maxim pass the universalization test also? "Whenever I participate in terrorist attacks involving multiple bombs, I shall always detonate the second bomb." Parts of Chapter 5 make a strong case for universalization, in the abstract, but more will need to be done to shore up the universalization test if Kantian natural law constructivism is to gain any traction.

Controversy is said to emerge among different forms of Kantian constructivism, over whether the universalization test should be given a modal or a voluntaristic interpretation (136). The latter, attributed to realm-of-ends contractualists, takes as fundamental the volitional consent of parties to a hypothetical agreement, or what fully rational agents would necessarily will. The former, modal interpretation, which is seen as essential for natural law constructivism, emphasizes instead only what rational agents can will: "Act only on the maxim you can will to become a universal law." But it is not clear that contractualists are committed to invoking any interpretation of the universalization test at all. Discussion of the issue is obscure, and seems at times tangential (e.g., 139-44). An argument supporting the modal interpretation is promised for a subsequent chapter, but (as will become evident shortly) the argument is invalid as presented.

The defense of Kantian natural law constructivism culminates in a reconstruction of "rights of possession," in Chapter 8. This demonstration of the constructivist method seems designed to show, in part, that the universalization test interpreted modally (non-contractually) can generate at least one impressive principle of justice. Three natural facts are taken as basic for rights of possession: (1) "we cannot will our ends into existence, ex nihilo"; (2) "we cannot simultaneously physically hold or occupy all that living, even at a subsistence level, requires"; (3) "we are too populous to avoid one another and each other's things and projects" (157-8). The construction of rights of possession additionally appeals to the principle of the hypothetical imperative, seen as natural for human agency: that it is irrational not to take the available means to one's ends, and a fortiori, irrational to make them unavailable.

On that basis, the following "Maxim of Arrogant Willing" is shown to fail the universalization test: "Whenever the sole sufficient means to achieve my ends happens to include things possessed by others, I will nevertheless regard them as being under my control and will use them to achieve my ends" (160). In other words, I shall use whatever I need, regardless of who possesses it. This maxim is said to fail the universalization test because willing that it become a universal law is willing, in effect, that everyone else may control your possessions needed to achieve your ends and so willing would be irrational by the hypothetical imperative. The conclusion is that "by this Contradiction in Conception test (using the Universal Law of Justice), we are obligated to support a system of rights to possession, in particular, by respecting others' particular rights to their possessions" (161-2).

Yet the maxim of arrogant willing actually does not fail the universalization test as claimed. Its universalization using the Universal Principle of Justice does not generate a contradiction in conception. Acting on that maxim is consistent with everyone's freedom of choice, which is a sufficient condition for its passing the principle-of-justice test; everyone can be free to use anyone's possessions. The maxim's universalization presents at most a "contradiction in willing," which according to Westphal will not do for his purpose (156). Directly parallel is Kant's example of the maxim never to aid others in need. It is supposed to fail the universalization test, but not because of a conceptual contradiction -- not because no world could exist in which it holds as a universal law. The problem is that willing to belong to such a world would be irrational, by the hypothetical imperative. Accordingly, that maxim failing the universalization test results in no more than an imperfect duty: sometimes to offer aid. Similarly with the maxim of arrogant willing: the contradiction in willing that arises from its universalization can justify no perfect duty of right. Its failure can justify nothing more than an imperfect duty: a duty to establish a convention of property, participation in which should be voluntary, in order to remain consistent with everyone's freedom. So the strictness of the resulting rights, among the participating parties only, will be justified contractually. It remains unclear how far this result may fulfill the earlier promise made on behalf of the universalization test's modal interpretation (138).

I reaffirm what I said at the beginning: this book is history of philosophy done right. But that is not the same as history of philosophy gotten right. Although its story of how Hume and Kant reconstruct natural law is not always accurate, Westphal makes a compelling case for the contemporary relevance of natural law constructivism.