Human Dignity: A Way of Living

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Peter Bieri, Human Dignity: A Way of Living, Diana Siclovan (tr.), Polity, 2017, 245pp., $29,95 (hbk), ISBN 9780745689012.

Reviewed by Jan-Willem van der Rijt, University of Bayreuth


Peter Bieri examines dignity not, as is often the case in contemporary philosophical literature, as an inherent property that all human beings are thought to possess simply by virtue of their being human, but as a lived experience. Thus, the subject of this book is not the type of dignity that is frequently regarded as, for instance, the basis of human rights, but the kind of dignity that we refer to when we say that someone has "comported herself with great dignity" in the way she handled a challenging situation, or has "thrown away his dignity" by performing a contemptible act. The book is concerned with the type of dignity that can be lost, destroyed, but also regained through the way we act and the way we are treated by others. In concentrating on this type of contingent dignity, the book addresses a topic that has probably not received the level of attention that it warrants in recent academic literature. Moreover, through the extremely vivid descriptions of the various circumstances in which persons can come to experience a loss of dignity that the book provides, it leaves no doubt as to just how important it is to not only analyse dignity in the context of enormities like torture, genocide or totalitarian oppression, but also to pay careful attention to the way it features in more everyday situations, such as personal and professional relationships.

As Bieri conceives of dignity, it is not a clearly defined unified concept, but something that is experienced in the way we deal with the ever-present threats to 'our lives as thinking, experiencing and acting beings' (p.3) that result from human fragility. Dignity then, is 'the existential response to the existential experience of being under threat' (p.3). Bieri doubts there is much to be gained from developing a philosophical theory of dignity, preferring instead to establish the importance of the experience of dignity (and its loss) by carefully describing the many different forms this threat can take, and the various ways one can respond to them. This is reflected in the structure of the book. Each chapter deals with a particular type of experienced dignity: autonomy, encounter, respect for intimacy, truthfulness, self-respect, moral integrity, a sense of what matters, and the acceptance of finitude. The chapters are then divided in specific sections -- too numerous to name individually here -- each of which deal with a particular way the type of dignity at issue in the chapter can be threatened. The result is a veritable kaleidoscope of descriptions and analyses, often varying significantly in length and depth, of different experiences in which dignity is at stake.

Before moving to the more substantively evaluative part of this review, two issues must be mentioned. The first concerns the target audience of the book. Though the book is presented as a work of philosophy (p.1), it does not seem to be aimed primarily at academic philosophers, but at a more general audience. There are, for instance, relatively few references, and those there are predominantly concern non-philosophical sources (e.g. literary fiction or biographies). The writing style also differs significantly from standard philosophical texts and seems primarily to seek to evoke an emotional reaction in the reader, rather than to convince by detailed rationalistic argumentation. The second point concerns the stated aims of the book. Bieri claims that his 'intention is not to be in the right about anything' but that his goal is merely 'to make certain things visible and comprehensible' (p.4). I remain unsure exactly how this is to be understood, for although Bieri at multiple occasions openly expresses that he is less than fully certain that his way of looking at a situation is the only (right) one -- and this seems fully appropriate to me, as it appears sensible to leave open the possibility that there is more than one dignified way to respond to a particular threat -- he very clearly does take a position in many of the situations he describes. Certain responses are undignified (e.g. self-betrayal, begging for emotional reactions, betrayal of intimacy, enjoying others' powerlessness or suffering, superstition, refusing to accept responsibility for one's misdeeds) and certain practices evidently do constitute an affront to dignity in Bieri's eyes (peep and freak shows, the Amsterdam red light district, paparazzi, despotic societies, and discriminatory practices, to name but a few). In truth, the claim that he does not seek 'to be in the right about anything' does not seem really sustainable: this is not an introductory textbook, and the book would be quite empty if the author did not seek to convince the reader of anything.

Bieri's argumentative strategy appears aimed at getting the reader to emotionally respond to a particular experience of (in)dignity by describing a specific situation in which a person's dignity is under threat -- to invite the reader to imagine sharing the experience, one could say -- and then to analyse what, exactly, about that particular experience makes it so painful or devastating (an example from early in the book is the firing of Willy Loman in Death of a Salesman). Often this analysis takes the form of expanding the initial situation or scenario to show how dignity could have been saved, or what other threats might have occurred if the protagonist had acted differently. In this fashion, Bieri seeks to identify exactly what element of the case at hand creates the threat to dignity, and what aspect of the actions of the protagonists accounts for the indignity or made possible the retention of dignity.

For such a strategy, a lot depends on the reader indeed having the emotional response that the author intends. In this lies both one of the great strengths and one of the main weaknesses of the book. One the one hand, the portrayals of situations that threaten dignity are often extremely vivid and gripping. Bieri is a renowned novelist as well as a philosopher, and his skill at painting a situation and manipulating his readers' emotions is very evident. When one agrees with the point Bieri wants to make, sharing his viewpoint in the situations he describes, empathising with the characters is easy, and his analyses can be very captivating indeed. However, in cases where one does not, or believes that other elements of the situation described are more crucial than the one(s) Bieri decides to elaborate, then the analyses can fall flat. To Bieri, emotions appear crucial, because it is through our emotions that we experience dignity and indignity, but, especially for readers with more rationalist inclinations, there can be a bit too much emphasis on the emotional aspect of the cases at hand. Especially when one notices the way one's emotions are being steered by Bieri's skillful depictions, one can feel inclined to deliberately step back from Bieri's analyses and ask 'is this really the way to look at this case?' When one does so, much of the convincingness of Bieri's analyses is in danger of dissipating.

At the risk of sounding like an apologist for my profession, I should also mention that, in my view, the minimal engagement with philosophical literature constitutes a notable shortcoming of the book. As Bieri's primary intended audience apparently does not consist of academic philosophers, I have no problem with him failing to engage with various philosophical analyses in the detail one would expect in a purely academic work. Yet to almost fully disregard what philosophers have said about the issues at hand constitutes the other extreme. Even if the goal is merely to make things visible and comprehensible, as Bieri claims, it would seem that at least some of the insights developed by academic philosophers over the years would be conducive to that goal. In several instances, Bieri blithely ignores crucial analytical distinctions that could fairly easily have been made accessible to a general audience (especially for someone with Bieri's writing skill), and as a result obscures matters, rather than making them visible or comprehensible. A particularly notable example of this occurs in Chapter 5, 'Dignity as Self-Respect', where the crucial distinction between self-respect and self-esteem, widely accepted in philosophical literature for decades, is wholly ignored. Due to his conflation of these two different notions, Bieri's analyses in this chapter are greatly hampered.

The book thus has important strengths, but also notable weaknesses. Due to the kaleidoscopic structure, it is not possible to engage with even a representative sample of Bieri's many separate analyses in detail here. In order to nonetheless illustrate the strengths and shortcomings of the book, I will focus on one particular example. This example is taken from the section 'Punishment: Development Instead of Destruction' (part of Chapter 6 'Dignity as Moral Integrity').

In this section, Bieri addresses the question of punishment of criminals. First, he juxtaposes two standard approaches to punishment: retribution and rehabilitation. Retribution, according to Bieri, is focused on the victim's perspective and his or her desire for revenge that follows from the 'outrage, anger and even hate' that the criminal's infliction of suffering on the victim has brought about. Retribution is about 'requiting suffering with suffering' (p.178). Rehabilitation, on the other hand, is presented as primarily concerned with the perpetrator as a being with dignity and regards 'punishment as a form of forced education'. Rehabilitation seeks to (forcibly) instill in the perpetrator a desire to change. Subsequently, Bieri goes on to depict, in typical chilling style, the horrors that prisoners experience in jail by graphically describing the many subtle and less subtle, and frequently unnecessary, humiliations that prisoners are exposed to. Prison life, as Bieri portrays it, is one large, sustained assault on the dignity of prisoners. The section then closes with a discussion with a prison warden, where the warden defends the prison conditions on retributivist grounds, whilst the author advocates the rehabilitative view. To Bieri, only the latter perspective is respectful of dignity, as it does not reduce the criminal's whole existence to suffering for his or her crime, but treats him or her as a being who can be changed and therefore has an 'open future', whilst the retributivist approach annihilates the prisoner's dignity.

As stated, the depiction of the prison conditions is especially gripping, and I do not expect that many readers who are genuinely concerned about the dignity of human beings can feel anything other than revulsion at prison systems that meet Bieri's description. In this regard, Bieri again makes his point very successfully: these types of prison are unacceptable. At the same time, however, the section exemplifies the type of shortcoming that one finds throughout the book. Bieri uses the horrific conditions of the type of prison he portrays to attack retributivism, and to establish the moral superiority of the rehabilitative approach. He never, however, allows for any serious counterargument or different perspective. He does not explore the way in which the rehabilitative approach can itself be a serious threat to dignity, and his description of retributivism is far from fair. One can very easily defend a retributivist view of punishment and reject the type of prison conditions that Bieri describes.

One of the fundamental problems with Bieri's portrayal of retributivism is that he assumes the demand for retribution must be based on a purely emotional desire to requite suffering with suffering, but that is not what the more plausible forms of retributivism do. Retributivism (at least in its more plausible forms) is less concerned with the suffering of the victim than it is with the fact that the victim was wronged, and that such a wrong cannot go unanswered. Such a form of retributivism is primarily concerned with the status of victims, and only secondarily with their suffering, if it is concerned with suffering at all. Moreover, such a form of retributivism explicitly presupposes the dignity of the perpetrator, as only beings with dignity can be held responsible for their actions. Whilst such a form of retributivism does seek a type of punishment that can be said to fit the crime, respecting both the status of the victim and that of the perpetrator, it will have little incentive to try to achieve this fit by humiliating the perpetrator in the ways Bieri so graphically describes.

At the same time, the rehabilitative view that Bieri favours is often deemed highly dubious from the perspective of dignity. The reason this is so, is that it treats the criminal, not as a person who can be held responsible for his or her actions, accepting her punishment as what her misdeeds require and continuing her life after the punishment is over, but treats criminals as somehow defective human beings who need to fixed. Bieri hails the possible outcome of forced re-education as respecting the 'open future' of the criminal, but one can very well wonder how 'open' this future really is. Precisely because it is forcibly instilled in the criminal, it is doubtful that such re-education is, for instance, compatible with dignity as autonomy (the importance of which Bieri stressed in Chapter 1). It warrants mention that 'rehabilitation' is and has been the favourite justification of punishment used by various totalitarian regimes.

Though a retributivist myself, I do not intend these short remarks as a decisive refutation of the rehabilitative view -- they are far too succinct for that. Rather, they are meant to illustrate some of the problems that occur throughout the book. Bieri does not appear particularly interested in providing a fair and balanced description of the views he rejects, and he does not explore the possible drawbacks of the positions he favours in any serious detail, overlooking the fact that they can often be highly problematic in terms of dignity themselves.

In the final analysis, then, one retains a somewhat ambivalent feeling about the book. The book has notable strengths. It is written in a compelling style that is highly accessible to its apparent target audience. Due to the vividness of its descriptions, it successfully establishes the importance of the type of dignity that has received less attention in recent philosophical literature than it warrants. I could also easily see excerpts of the book being used in the classroom, making evident to students what type of things may affect our dignity and that such matters may be important, before confronting them with more rigorous theoretical analyses of dignity. In terms of establishing the intuitive importance of dignity, the book clearly has merit. However, when it comes to the question whether it really enhances our understanding of dignity, providing the reader with a coherent picture of what dignity is and giving a convincing account of its practical and normative implications, it is less helpful. Due to its particular argumentative strategy and kaleidoscopic structure, it leaves much, perhaps a bit too much, underanalysed.