Human Dignity and Political Criticism

Human Dignity And Political Criticism 1

Colin Bird, Human Dignity and Political Criticism, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 276pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108832021.

Reviewed by Ariel Zylberman, University at Albany, SUNY


The concept of human dignity encapsulates three powerful ideals: all human beings, rather than those belonging to some socioeconomic elite, are supposed to have the same dignity (Universality and Equality); such dignity generates a duty of respect owed to the individual (Direction); and the duty of respect is particularly exigent, presumptively blocking the aggregative calculations favored by classical utilitarians (Grip). The ideal of human dignity, roughly so understood, has arguably become a dominant conceptual device for expressing the distinct kind of value enjoyed by individuals. As a result, the ideal of dignity informs a wide range of moral and political forms of criticism, from efforts to reform legal systems to make them conform more perfectly to the principle of equal dignity to social movements defending the idea that Black Lives Matter. And yet, as the ideal of dignity expands its critical reach, so too does it attract increased philosophical scrutiny, potentially feeding skepticism.

Colin Bird’s new book is a sophisticated meditation on the ideal of dignity. Rather than defending a traditional understanding of dignity or succumbing to skepticism, Bird seeks to develop a novel account. The basic idea is to flip the traditional order of explanation upside-down. Instead of supposing that dignity represents the worth of individuals generating a duty of respect, Bird argues that dignity comes after respect: dignity is a worth imparted on others when you respect them. Rather than a localized feature of individuals in isolation, then, dignity is a relational feature that emerges from actual intersubjective relations of respect. Bird argues that such a revisionist approach stands the best chance of vindicating the animating anti-utilitarian idea (Grip) that every person matters for their own sake and is better able to explain why structural forms of oppression, discrimination, and racism are so threatening to human dignity.

In order to diagnose the difficulties of traditional accounts and to launch his revisionist alternative, Bird introduces a potentially illuminating typology organized around two axes: is human dignity fixed or changing? And is the locus of dignity inherent to the individual or ambient among persons? (51) Combined, the two axes yield four possible concepts of dignity: A (vulnerable and inherent); B (invulnerable and inherent); C (invulnerable and ambient); and D (vulnerable and ambient). The typology is meant to serve two purposes: disambiguating the concept of dignity and adding nuance to one’s account. Bird is clear that the “typology should not be taken too rigidly” (52). Nevertheless, Bird puts the typology to use by arguing, with the skeptic, against the “traditional” views of dignity (mainly B and C) and by defending D-type dignity, what Bird calls a “revisionist” account. This typology also helps Bird clearly organize the book: Part I sets up and explains the concept; Part II argues against the traditional approach; and Part III articulates and begins to defend the revisionary approach.

My sense is that the most original and important contribution of the book is Part III, so I’ll focus on that in what remains. But let me briefly explain why Bird thinks that ‘traditional’ accounts of dignity fail.

Chapter 5 targets B-type (invulnerable and inherent) dignity and sharpens two familiar arguments against it. B-Type accounts threaten to mystify the concept, for if dignity is neither a socially constituted fact nor an empirical one, it’s hard to see how dignity could fit within a naturalized metaphysics (72). Next, B-type accounts appear normatively inert: if dignity really is invulnerable and inherent, then how could it generate any normative guidance in our actual, social world? (78)

The difficulties for B-type accounts are now fairly well understood in the literature and have prompted some philosophers to shift to a more relational understanding of dignity. For instance, Stephen Darwall seeks to explain dignity as a ‘second-personal authority’ (2006, 2013), and inspired by Kant’s philosophy of right, Arthur Ripstein conceives dignity as a right to independent purposiveness (2009). Bird labels such accounts C-type and argues against them in Chapter 6.

Chapter 6 is probably the most important and original of Part II, since this is where Bird needs to establish some distance between his own account and other relational ones. As far as I can tell, Bird’s main objection to C-type relational accounts is that they reduce dignity to a mere passport-dignity, “essentially a formalistic status” (99). After introducing the neologism ‘timanthropic’ to refer to the “valuation of lives and people” (45), Bird argues that C-type views miss the timanthrophic character of dignity: by reducing dignity to a formal, quasi-juridical status, such accounts are unable to explain why persons matter in actual social interactions. As a result, he claims, “agents could face regular humiliation, various forms of structural oppression, racism, sexism, degradation, and so on, but none of this impinges on dignity as [C-type]” (107).

If Bird’s argument in Part II is sound, then traditional accounts of human dignity fail to deliver on their most basic promise, namely, explaining why individuals are sources of exigent claims to respect (Grip). Part III embarks on reconceiving dignity so as to better deliver on that promise.

Here, I think, is where Bird’s account really takes off, for Bird in effect proposes to flip the standard way of understanding dignity upside down. To see this, recall the three ideals dignity is typically thought to encapsulate:

Universal and Equal Scope: all human beings have the same dignity;

Direction: an individual’s dignity generates a duty of respect;

Grip: the duty to respect an individual’s dignity is especially exigent, embodying a presumptive constraint on aggregation.

Although this is not how Bird himself puts it, the revisionary approach seeks to preserve Grip by reversing Direction and rejecting Universality. Dignity is not an inherent feature of individuals, but a vulnerable achievement that emerges intersubjectively when an individual is recognized and respected by others (204). Bird’s revisionist account is performative: the duty of respect is not directed at the other’s worth, but rather, it is the actual performance of respect that imparts worth on another (115). And since dignity becomes contingent on the degree of respect one is actually afforded, dignity is an essentially comparative value, inevitably coming in degrees. But if dignity is comparative, it is practically impossible for all individuals to enjoy equal dignity—at least so long as some form of disrespect is actual. This, it seems to me, is the most innovative part of the book.

What I’m calling the reversal of direction is probably Bird’s boldest and most intriguing proposal. Bird carefully develops an analogy between the economic value of commodities and the non-economic value of dignity. Bird remarks that one of the greatest innovations of modern economic theory was to reject the medieval ‘just price’ theory that economic value was an intrinsic feature of objects in favor of an intersubjective account of economic value as the result of human valuings (69). Bird’s proposal is that the same reversal must take place in a theory of dignity: away from dignity as a fixed, inherent property of individuals and towards an intersubjective account where dignity is the result of being valued by others.

Bird traces this analogy back to Samuel Pufendorf, who argued that just as money is the currency tracking economic value, so too is esteem the attentional currency tracking the worth people come to possess or to lose (128). Bird analyses love and respect similarly, as “attentional currencies rendering the relative worth of their objects—in this case people—socially legible” (162). To respect another, then, is not to react or recognize an independent worth but rather to impart value on another. Developing insights from both Marx and F. A. Hayek, Bird explains the property of having value in terms of complex, emergent structures of interactions where individuals are valued.

With the reversal move in place, the second move must follow: if dignity is a value imparted by actual relations of recognition, then the personal value of dignity must come in degrees. One challenge of this implication is how to preserve the distinction between the economic value of things and the non-economic value of people. Bird builds an effective argument that respect valorizes in a different kind of way from economic valorizations. Respect valorizes through ‘attentional precedence’ (188): those deemed worthy of respect are thereby deemed worthy of being “attended to before others” (189). Respect constitutes dignity by assigning attentional precedence to people over other forms of valorization, like the economic value of things.

On the revisionist view, “human dignity is a function of agents’ de facto power to command in significant others attentional precedence” (208). The revisionist view has two important advantages. Where B-Type views easily mystify the concept (dignity as a transcendent property that is neither empirical nor social), Bird’s D-type view wholly naturalizes dignity, for dignity is a socially emergent property that obtains only when people are, in fact, accorded respect. And the revisionist account foregrounds how important the social dimension of dignity really is, potentially illuminating why dignity is at stake when others fail to respect you in contexts of oppression, racism, or humiliation. 

My main worry is that Bird’s argument underestimates the explanatory power of “traditional” views and overestimates the explanatory power of the revisionist view.

Begin with “traditional” relational views. Although Bird is initially careful to note that his typology “should not be taken too rigidly” and that the borders defining each type are “permeable membranes”, Bird’s critique of C-type (relational) views seems to presuppose the very kind of rigidity he initially disavows. But relational accounts of dignity need not be as static and rigidly C-Type as Bird supposes.

Bird’s critique is that C-type accounts focus too much on relations of disobedience to authority (153) and so miss the ‘timanthropic’ dimension of dignity, the way in which dignity is a way of valuing people. But that seems wrong. Take, for instance, Darwall’s second-personal account. It seems to me wrong to say that Darwall’s primary concern is with disobedience to one’s authority. In fact, Darwall pioneered the distinction between recognition and appraisal respect, and recognition respect is the  

kind of respect [that] consists in giving appropriate consideration or recognition to some feature of its object in deliberating about what to do. (1977: 38)

In other words, Darwall’s recognition respect is timanthropic in Bird’s sense: it’s a way of recognizing the importance of people (or features of people) in deliberating about what to do. It’s just that Darwall insists that this importance is not reducible to other comparative forms of merit and is intimately tied to an individual’s “second-personal authority” to make demands on others.

Bird’s second main objection is that neither traditional account (non-relational or relational) can “adequately explain how the worth of persons is urgently at stake”, for both assume that dignity is a “fixed and unchanging quality” (108). While this is a good challenge for B type accounts, which construe dignity as a kind of transcendental kernel of value, it is much less forceful against C-type, relational accounts, which construe dignity as a form of interpersonal relationship. After all, when Ripstein construes dignity as a kind of status of being sui iuris, he emphasizes how this status sets a normative requirement prohibiting any form of domination, erecting powerful normative claims both interpersonally and against the state. To be sure, the account may be incomplete in various ways—for instance, by not being clear enough on structural forms of oppression. But Bird’s own charge that C-type accounts can’t explain how dignity is urgently at stake seems to miss the rich interpersonal and relational resources that C-type accounts have available.

Turning now to Bird’s constructive proposal, my concern is that the revisionist account appears far less able to explain Grip than Bird acknowledges.

Begin with Bird’s rejection of equal dignity. This is a conceptual implication of Bird’s construing dignity as a comparative value. If dignity just consists in the social fact that one is actually respected by others, then dignity necessarily comes in degrees, for every individual will be actually respected to various extents. But a key implication of this view is the surprising denial that all human beings have the same dignity.

Bird acknowledges the “counterintuitive, even heretical” character of his proposal (113). But he argues that the very notion of an absolute “nonrelative ‘rank’” makes no sense at all, for such categories “depend on implicit comparisons with others” (182). Further, on Bird’s rich account, love and respect are dispositions “to compare their objects as mattering more and less in particular dimensions” (187). So, Bird concludes, the very notion that dignity captures a non-comparative value and equal status makes no sense, for it implicitly presupposes comparative judgments of mattering.

This line of thought, I suspect, is ultimately far more problematic for the revisionist account than Bird acknowledges because it brings into focus a fundamental question about the very normativity of the revisionist view.

The difficulty might be easiest to see by shifting to the revisionist account’s second distinctive move, the reversal of direction. A virtue of traditional “reactive” views, as Bird calls them, is that they offer a natural explanation of the duty of respect: you must respect others because they have dignity. However, once the direction is reversed and dignity is the product of respecting others, then a deep question about normativity emerges: why should you respect others? If dignity is nothing more than a social fact emerging from certain patterns of interaction, then it’s not at all clear to me where the normative force comes from in this account. Construed as a social fact, a product of actually being respected by others, dignity is normatively empty.

Of course, the revisionist view is not meant to be normatively empty. The normativity appears to come in through the back door in terms of the notion of the worth of individuals. Here is a clear example:

‘Devalorization’ no more changes anyone’s value as a human being, still less renders anyone worthless, than a restaurant’s going bust establishes that it had no culinary merit. Indeed, devalorization tells us nothing about any one person as such. It is a condition in which the value of human beings loses any power to shape the attention and treatment they receive from others. Their real worth no longer makes any impact. (218)

The reversal of direction entails that the value of dignity is imparted by the social fact that others respect you. But reversal of direction makes it wholly mysterious why others should respect you, since dignity cannot be an antecedent value commanding respect but can only be a product of actually being respected. In order to preserve the normative structure of the account, then, the revisionist account appeals to your value as a human being or your real worth as a person. But notice that such value or worth holds independently of social facts of being respected.

What begins to emerge is a very serious dilemma for the revisionary view. On the one hand, if the account remains consistently revisionist, it appears to entail that the very notion of dignity is normatively empty, reducing to sets of social facts tracking the degree to which various individuals accord each other respect. But if that is so, then the revisionist account is not only unable to explain Grip, it is unable to explain how dignity generates any normative requirements whatsoever.  On the other hand, the revisionist account can bring normative structure back in by implicitly appealing to an independent notion of the value or worth of human beings, a value they have independently of actual social relations of respect and recognition. Bird appears to make this move (in addition to 218 above, see also 208, 229, 232). But then, the revisionist account gains normative structure and explanatory power only by presupposing a non-revisionist view of dignity as the value or worth of persons independent of actual social relations of respect. If so, the revisionist account would have normative power to support forms of moral and political criticism only by presupposing the very notions of value and dignity it disavowed. The dilemma of normativity, as we might call it, is that the revisionist account is either normatively empty or gains normative power only by implicitly relying on non-revisionist views of value and dignity.

The dilemma of normativity seems to pose a very serious difficulty for the revisionist view. But I think a great virtue of Bird’s rich account is that he offers the conceptual resources to move us beyond it. Recall: when he introduces the typology of dignity concepts in Chapter 4, he is clear that the conceptual boundaries are not rigid but are more like “permeable membranes”. In a way, my worries both about Bird’s critique of ‘traditional’ accounts (especially relational, C-type) and his defense of a revisionary account (especially, the D-type) are connected to Bird not taking sufficiently seriously his own advice and treating the conceptual boundaries between C- and D-type views as too rigid. The upshot, I worried, is that the critique of C-type views might misconstrue their potential and the defense of D-type view ends up being so close to the social facts so as to end up being devoid of normativity. I would have liked to see in this book an exploration of what dignity “at the boundaries” of Bird’s typology, so to speak, might look like.

Of course, none of this detracts from Bird’s important accomplishment in this book. As Bird himself insightfully puts it, to those who are skeptical of his approach, he offers two pleas: “exploring unconventional lines of argument can be instructive even if in the end we find the resulting position problematic; and that sometimes, as I believe is the case here, it can nudge reflection into unexpectedly fertile territory and open new possibilities” (113–114). Bird’s book, I think, succeeds in both regards. His subtle discussion of dignity is only bound to add sophistication to the debate between traditionalist and skeptical accounts of dignity. And his very insightful account of the phenomenology of respect should nudge reflection into unexpectedly fertile territory. This is an excellent and rich book.