Human Nature and the Limits of Science

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Dupre, John, Human Nature and the Limits of Science, Oxford University Press, 2001, 201pp, $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-924806-0.

Reviewed by Harmon R. Holcomb III, University of Kentucky


Evolutionary psychology (hereafter EP), like sociobiology before it, attempts to explain a range of topics across the human condition. EP is now mainstream science that has convinced psychologists of the need to provide functional explanations of human mental capacities and explain functional design by natural selection for reproductive success. This book is the latest philosophical spin on the well-known Gould-Lewontin-Kitcher critique, namely, that the alleged accomplishments of these sciences are only pretensions. More precisely, EP is bad science that lends support to pernicious conservative social policy and has appeal because of bad ideology and bad philosophy. Dupré’s contribution is to add philosophical depth to this critique by grounding it in a rejection of metaphysical monism (the idea that one science can explain everything) and an endorsement of metaphysical pluralism (the idea that there are facts about human nature beyond the limits of evolutionary science in particular and science in general).

This view of his project is evident from the fact that his arguments, stated in Chapters Two, Three, and Four, are littered with the attacks made by Stephen Jay Gould, Richard Lewontin (cited as his inspiration in his Preface), and Philip Kitcher (cited as a commentator on the manuscript in his Acknowledgements). In the first four chapters and especially Chapter Five, he explains why evolutionists conduct such “obviously” bad science, at two related levels of generality. The first level is bad scientific ideologies of biological determinism (all human events are biologically, genetically determined) and mechanism (humans are machines), vulgar adaptationism (all traits are adaptations), neo-Social Darwinism (alleged evolutionary facts are value-laden and basing private decisions and public policy on them has dangerous consequences), and reductionism (all areas of psychology are unified by evolutionary thinking). The second level is bad metaphysics: scientism (all profound questions about human nature are answerable by science and in particular by EP), scientific imperialism (the good idea of natural selection is exported from its original domain to inappropriate domains), and anti-environmentalism (explanations in terms of intrinsic structural properties are favored over those in terms of social, historical, or cultural context/environment).

Dupré’s positive alternative to EP (Chapter Five) is a short, sketchy, programmatic case for the thesis that the resources of the mind are constituted by our social context and not just by ancestral genes, that language is a property of a linguistic community, and that therefore sociocultural norms are inherent in human nature. Dupré treats the ensuing sociopolitical issue of how we ought to act (Chapter Six) by suggesting a natural marriage of EP and neoclassical economics: EP tells us which values, preferences, or ends are immutable results of evolution by natural and sexual selection and rational-choice theory in neoclassical economics tells us how to behave so as to maximize our individual interests given by ancestral selection pressures. He then blasts this union, as before, for deficiencies and motivation in bad ideology and bad philosophy. The book concludes (Chapter Seven) with the suggestion that our free will consists in autonomy (agent-causation) due to our ability to choose among society’s range of values by following our own principles, finding free will in the linguistically mediated interaction of individual and society. The book as a whole is an illustration of metaphysical pluralism: no single approach has a complete picture of human nature, and a monist approach leads to disaster.

This one-sided book discusses no rebuttals by philosophers and hardly any by scientists other than the straw-man accusation that the critic of EP believes the mind is a “tabula rasa”. I shall give my response so that readers can see both sides of the issue. I agree with Dupré’s pluralistic metaphysics, but deny that EP must be or ought to be interpreted as anti-pluralistic. After thirty years of hearing a barrage of criticisms of sociobiology and EP, most EPers have ready rebuttals to the Gould-Lewontin-Kitcher critique that Dupré simply ignores. Applying Dupré’s own standards to himself: if EP is weak because it uncritically accepts “conceptual foundations and practical results that are far more problematic and controversial than its practitioners allow” (p.42), then his criticisms are weak because they uncritically accept the conceptual foundations and practical results of the Gould-Lewontin-Kitcher critique that are far more problematic and controversial than he allows. This polemical book has the potential to turn a whole generation of its readers against EP, as Kitcher’s book (1985) did earlier to sociobiology, blocking the path of scientific research and philosophical interest in it. Thus, the issue of how to evaluate EP’s aim, validity and significance is, in William James’s sense, “forced, live, and momentous”.

My experience is that if you have bought into the Gould-Lewontin critique of sociobiology, then you will use it to interpret EP as well. Analysis reveals that Dupré’s strategy of reasoning is (1) to take as his points of departure the Gould-Lewontin critique in conjunction with the thesis of his earlier book (1993) that the traditional idea of a uniform scientific project gradually spreading its light across the full range of our interests is a myth; (2) to find instances of that myth in science in order to show that his earlier book actually applies to something scientists believe; (3) to exploit the debate over evolutionary studies of human mind and behavior to project this myth onto sociobiology, EP (and neoclassical economics, for good measure) as fields that live or die with the aim stated in (1) above; (4) to rely on background everyday beliefs about human nature, which beg the question by generating questions and answers whose assumptions disconnect evolutionary theory from known facts, in order to expose defects in those fields; (5) to take the absurdities and failures produced by interpreting evolutionary approaches, methods, and results with the requirement in (3) that EP explain the whole truth about human nature as conclusive proof of its failure in principle and in practice; and (6) to explain the absurdities and failures, not as a reductio ad absurdam of his interpretation of evolutionary research in (3), but as gaining their appeal through scientist’s belief in bad ideology and bad philosophy.

I take the book to constitute a challenging philosophy of science. Dupré’s unique starting point is his analysis of the methodology of the modeling which is found throughout EP. I agree that scientific models do not supply “the whole truth” about anything to which they apply. Instead, a model represents, not a whole real entity, but an idealized type of physical or biological entity in which a relation between variables that is mathematically precise and general is gotten only because the model represents only some aspect of the entity in some way and to some extent. Dupré’s introduction draws numerous implications from modeling for the nature and limits of science: science has traditionally been conceived as finding the whole truth about something, but this is something it cannot do. This leads to his three themes of why scientism, scientific imperialism, and the centrality of the endogenous (anti-environmentalism) are failed viewpoints.

So, the key question for promoting, rather than criticizing, evolutionary research is: how should we do evolutionary research without these “isms”? I fully agree that no single science is the privileged key to human nature and accept the obvious pluralistic alternative that any subject matter can be discussed using a variety of sciences and humanistic disciplines. In my book on sociobiology (Holcomb, 1993), I met the first challenge of developing a detailed philosophical theory of how to interpret and evaluate sociobiology without attributing to it the totalizing, exclusionary metaphysical claim that it is able to explain everything. In my anthology on EP (Holcomb, 2001), I met the second challenge of interpreting EP without attributing to it an innatist vulgar adaptationism. The anthology provides positive research strategies for meeting genuine major issues that lie beneath the pseudo-issues Dupré raises: reconciling evolutionary and developmental perspectives on human nature (clarifying the familial and social environment), understanding how evolved strategies actually work to produce reproductively effective behaviors, and transcending vulgar adaptationism and informing sophisticated adaptationism with phylogenetics. Let me explain how I met both challenges.

As to the first challenge, if we are pluralists, then we can (ironically) chide Dupré’s book for being based on the fallacious inference that, just because these sciences can be interpreted in the Gould-Lewontin-Kitcher way, they therefore must or ought to be interpreted in this way. Since there is always more than one way to look at something, it is more constructive to take the project of these sciences as having limited domains (that is, each science recognizes that it is one among many) than as trying to exhaustively explain everything (that is, as regarding each science as a full blown metaphysics). I already defused much of the controversy raised by the Gould-Lewontin-Kitcher interpretation in my earlier book in extensive discussion of their views, replacing Dupré’s concept of unlimited completeness (when a science, such as physics is fixed, everything is fixed, the whole truth is given (Dupré, 2001, p.7)) with limited completeness (an established theory would be explanatorily complete if it explained everything in its domain in need of explanation (Holcomb, 1993, p.11)). If you don’t believe my “been there, done that” response, read my 1993 book for such passages as this:

Intuitively, there is no reason why sociobiology has to endorse such ambitious claims in order for it to be a legitimate, valid science. Indeed, such ambitions seem to hinder its becoming a legitimate, valid science. This unlimited scope pushes us to always go for more, rather than to circumscribe our project to finding feasible solutions to manageable problems. It is hard to see how a science with such an unlimited scope could ever be successful.
The quest for a completed evolutionary theory carries a rationale for doing human sociobiology internal to science. This aim legitimates the field in principle but does not validate it as practiced, which also depends on the quality of its explanatory method and explanatory results. By distinguishing two kinds of projects according to their scope, we can identify what sort of human sociobiology is illegitimate and what sort of human sociobiology is legitimate.
An effort to explain all human phenomena through natural selection acting directly on heritable phenotypic variation would involve biological determinism, reductionism, and adaptationism in some senses. Research programs committed to an unlimited domain are illegitimate because their resources for constructing total worldviews are so meager that they are blind to many behavioral facts. An effort to show that evolutionary theory is complete within its own scope, where the scope is limited to aspects of sociality involving cause-effect relations to survival or reproduction, does not entail an effort to explain all human social phenomena. Research programs committed to a limited domain of this sort are candidates for legitimacy since they do not aspire with “vaulting ambition” to be total worldviews. Human sociobiology, as disciplined inquiry aimed at completeness, is not a total world view, but an attempt to make evolutionary theory applicable to a part of its limited domain in whatever way is relevant to and consistent with the social data. As a science, it is not in need of a world-view interpretation. (Holcomb, 1993, pp.136-137)

This statement provides a conceptual foundation for transcending scientism and scientific imperialism, and my chapter (1993) on domain conceptualization provides an initial but detailed specification of how scientific methodology specifies limited domains. My earlier book started where Dupré’s book left off, and my evaluations of criticisms of sociobiology apply equally well to most of his types of criticisms of EP, revealing them as attacks on caricatures. His target is not EP, which like all other sciences has a limited domain and whose idea of natural selection is general enough to make a difference for previously held views of human nature but does not attempt to provide “the whole truth about everything” by itself. His straw man target is EP plus the absurd “nothing-butism” philosophical thesis of totalization or metaphysical monism: that the field exhausts all possible inquiry, and so no independently grounded psychological, social, or cultural science or humanity can tell us anything (namely, (1) and (3) in my previous analysis).

After Kuhn, all philosophers of science accept that how we describe what we know or don’t know is “theory-laden.” So, there is an evolutionary domain, though a limited one, that redescribes topics across the subject matter of human nature in relation to only some aspect of humans (as a biological species) in some way (in the theory-laden terms of evolutionary theory and models) and to some extent (to the extent EP can be done autonomously and then integrated with other fields). EP explains these topics within human nature as described in theory-laden terms, not the topics in their pre-evolutionary description that is amenable to treatment by any of the sciences and humanities. The deficiencies of EP are explained by a combination of reasons: by this project, by the fact that it is hard to decide what about humans is in need of evolutionary explanation, by the Kuhnian point that evolutionary explanations are irrelevant to or seem to be contradicted by descriptions laden by theories in other sciences and humanities which have not yet been integrated with evolutionary research, by Kuhn’s point that all sciences face “anomalies” and reflect human foibles, and by Lakatos’s point that scientists shelve work on intractable problems until they find a feasible way to solve them. This explanation is more faithful to the tradition in philosophy of science than Dupré’s projection of bad, dangerous ideologies and metaphysics onto the field, even if a few scientists believe their own advertising and are as uncritical about ideology and philosophy as the general public.

To address his second challenge, my introductions to my edited volume (Holcomb, 2001) of recent advances in EP show how to interpret it and evaluate it without landing in the innatist-adaptationist interpretation that Dupré applies to what I call “Buss-style research”. To document this, let me quote:

D.S. Wilson’s Title “Tasty Slice—But Where is the Rest of the Pie?” conveys his worry: if the public identifies “EP” with “Buss-style research” and Buss’s empirical work is guided by research strategies that ignore topics central to psychology, even the true information he reports will not be accepted until it is seen in the context of a larger story. In fact, some evolutionists want to avoid the term “EP” because they think it refers exclusively to a very specific innatist-adaptationist interpretation of how evolution operates: The mind is a set of evolved adaptations, encoded in discrete modules under genetic control and inherent in the human species, and identified by evidence of adaptive design. The whole pie is EP defined as “the study of mind and behavior from an evolutionary perspective”. How much of the pie did Buss omit? “Using his index as a guide, Buss devotes six pages to ‘culture,’ six pages to ‘development,’ two pages to ‘norms,’ two pages to ‘individual differences,’ one page to ‘learning’, and no pages to ‘morality,’ ‘religion,” ‘behavior genetics,’ or, for that matter, ‘brain’”(Wilson, 1999). Given the typical reader’s preconceptions about human mind and behavior—involving culture, individual development, norms, learning, and so forth—that seem to conflict with assumptions behind Buss’s interpretations of the empirical findings, people often find it is more reasonable to retain their assumptions and reject his conclusion than to throw out their entrenched preconceptions and accept Buss’s findings.
The present volume does not seek to cover the whole pie, but does aim to redress this imbalance by including contributions that pay attention to the particular omissions D.S. Wilson points out. Let me summarize how each part of the volume does so. (Holcomb, 2001, pp.xiv-xv; the reference is to Wilson’s review of Buss’s 1999 textbook).

Indeed, Dupré’s specific arguments explicitly claim irrelevance or seeming contradiction (which makes them problematic and controversial, in his terms) with what he assumes we know throughout his book, by drawing his own unargued bridge principles that connect the explanations of human sexual behavior with the very topics I state above. By stating what he knows in terms laden by common beliefs that bypass evolutionary theory-laden redescription, he generates disconnection that make EP unable to explain some aspects of these topics in some way and to some extent. Instead, EPers are “illuminating human nature” by explaining some aspects (aspects involving causal relations to survival or reproduction) of these topics in some way (say, in relation to primate social hierarchies, to anticipate my next example) and to some extent (say, to the extent that our species shows similarities to and differences from other species). They are working on unsolved evolutionary problems, eliminating explanatory incompleteness in a limited domain specific to evolutionary theory, not in an unlimited domain as Dupré charges. It is his own unargued bridge principles that create the absurdities and many of the defects; although EPers both use their paradigm and admit it has defects (anomalies, in Kuhn’s terms).

For example, to analyze just one crucial passage, his first chapter states his main antipathy against EP on the grounds that it attaches too much importance to genes and too little importance to social context (p.8). The criticism is that “the development of an organism is merely the implementation of a plan or the running of a program somehow written in the DNA, …a paradigm of the consequences of mechanistic distortion” and “EP extends this error to the very most complex subject matter, the human brain.” (p.8)

Now, evolutionists have for thirty years been saying that they are talking mostly about evolution, not development, that they are not committed to any particular view of development, certainly not to an innatist one, and that the relation between development and evolution in humans is a research topic to pursue. Buss, Cosmides and Tooby, and Dennett are the main targets of Dupré’s criticisms in later chapters, but their lack of commitment in some writings to a detailed hypothesis about how mental modules develop is not genetic determinism; they say that genes are necessary but not sufficient for the development of mental modules and that evolved strategies are executed using tactics and acts that count as proximate mechanisms of behavior, which are sensitive both to the organism’s content and context. There is a dialectical relation between organism and environment: organisms are generally well adapted to their environments in their causal interactions with it and their environments are incorporated constitutively into an organism’s capacities as the individual organism develops through processing of matter-energy and information.

The reason Dupré found causal but not constitutive roles for social, historical, and cultural contexts in EP (Dupré, 2001, p. 1) is that the literature he reviewed was mainly about evolutionary adaptation (the locus of the causal role) and not much about individual development (the locus of the constitutive role). These standard views in EP subsume Dupré’s alleged alternative to EP, namely, “that humans are, in important respects, constituted by the social contexts in which they exist: the capacities that they possess depend not just causally but constitutively on facts about their social contexts” (Dupré, 2001, p. 8).

Talk of “evolved psychological mechanisms” or “reproductive strategies” is just a functional redescription in evolution-relevant terms of the capacities we already knew about. That these capacities are constituted in part by their social contexts is a natural way to interpret Mealey’s fine textbook Sex Differences: Developmental and Evolutionary Strategies (Mealey, 2000) and my anthology’s Part One on reconciling evolution with development, e.g., Cummins (in Holcomb, 2001). Indeed, Dupré’s concern for the constitutive role is central to philosophy of mind, which focuses on the content of mental states. Cummins’s theory of the origin of intentionality in primates, which explores how intentionality develops in primate and human individuals in relation to social hierarchies, so that social resources are inherent constitutively in human intentionality, provides a point of departure for constructing a partnership (not a reductionism) between EP and philosophy of mind. So, Dupré’s alleged alternative to EP is in fact a specific thesis in EP.

This is just one example of how the issue of interdisciplinary relations is normally treated in EP by creating an integration of EP with other parts of evolutionary biology (e.g., life-history theory, phylogenetics) and other fields within psychology. EP studies construct these partnerships in ways that escape Dupré’s totalization or metaphysical-monism thesis. Basic quantificational logic shows that “For each topic, there is at least one evolutionary explanation of it” does not imply “The only explanation of each topic is an evolutionary explanation”. Thus, Dupré’s correct rejection of the latter claim (rejection of evolutionary metaphysical monism) does not entitle him to infer that the former claim is false (EP can be general enough to explain each topic without being a metaphysical monism). The literature that refutes his evaluation of EP has been there: he did not engage it closely enough to understand the project inherent in EP’s practice (for a rebuttal of Gould and Lewontin, see Andrews, Gangsted, and Mathews, forthcoming).

In conclusion, practice in EP violates Dupré’s main thesis of metaphysical monism and fits the more plausible thesis of pluralism for understanding the many sciences, provided we understand EP’s mission of completing evolutionary theoretical explanation by explaining human nature in terms of a limited rather than an unlimited domain.


Andres, P.W., Gangestad, S.W., and Matthews, D. "Adaptationism: How to Carry Out an Exaptationist Program", Behavioral and Brain Sciences, forthcoming, 2002 or 2003.

Buss, D.M. 1999. Evolutionary Psychology: The New Science of the Mind. Boston: Allyn & Bacon Press.

Cummins, D.D. "The Impact of the Social Environment on the Evolution of Mind," in Holcomb, 2001, pp.85-118.

Dupré, J. 1993. The Disorder of Things: Metaphysical Foundations of the Disunity of Science. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.

Holcomb, H. 1993. Sociobiology, Sex, and Science. Albany, NY: SUNY Press.

Holcomb, H., ed. 2001. Conceptual Challenges in Evolutionary Psychology: Innovative Research Strategies. Boston, Mass.: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Kitcher, P. 1985. Vaulting Ambition: Sociobiology and the Quest for Human Nature. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

Mealey, L. 2000. Sex Differences: Developmental and Evolutionary Strategies. San Diego, California: Academic Press.

Wilson, D.S. 1999. "Tasty Slice—But Where is the Rest of the Pie?" Evolution and Human Behavior, 20 ,279-287.