Human Rights and Human Well-being

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William J. Talbott, Human Rights and Human Well-being, Oxford University Press, 2010, 410pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195173482.

Reviewed by Colleen Murphy, Texas A&M University


The central project of William Talbott's Human Rights and Human Well-being is to defend a list of human rights that all governments should assure. Talbott's goal is to contribute to "an important explanatory project in political philosophy" (p. 3) begun with the publication of Mill's On Liberty. That project is to justify rights on consequentialist grounds by considering how the protection of such rights by governments increases human well-being. Talbott's analysis is a significant contribution to the literature on human rights, offering a rich and comprehensive consequentialist alternative to standard theories of human rights.

At the core of Talbott's account is a distinction between ground-level moral principles and meta-level principles. Ground-level moral thought (p. 8) refers to judgments about particular practices as well as general moral and legal norms and principles for conduct (pp. 14-15). An example of a ground-level moral norm is "coercion is wrong." Within ground-level moral thought we find both primary and secondary moral judgments. Primary moral judgments specify conduct, including the rights that governments should respect. Secondary moral judgments concern the justifiability of enforcing primary moral judgments, including the permissibility of punishment. By contrast, a moral meta-theory explains the appropriateness of our judgments at the ground-level, both in terms of why general moral norms are justified and when a ground-level norm applies to a given case (p. 8). Meta-level principles are needed to explain when a ground-level moral norm applies because there are typically exceptions to the general moral norms we develop. For example, coercion is usually, though not always, wrong.

Talbott is especially concerned with defending a meta-level principle he calls the "main principle." According to the main principle,

a change in or exception to status quo moral or legal practices is endorsed as an improvement by the main principle just in case the change, when evaluated as a substantive social practice and as a practice of implementation, would not reduce the life prospects of bystanders and would make the overall system of social practices one that does a better job of equitably promoting life prospects of all participants, except those covered by the responsible noncompliance exclusion, than the status quo system of practices, and also does a better job than any of the relevant alternatives (p. 66).

The main principle is a principle of moral reciprocity. Those who are willing to comply with a given social practice should have their life prospects equitably promoted by that practice. Bystanders, who fall outside the scope of reciprocity, need not have their life prospects promoted equitably but simply not reduced by a practice. Talbott does not offer a definition of social practices, but implies that social practices refer to norms or principles (either legal or moral) that are as a matter of fact generally followed by those subject to them. The main principle is also comparative; the justification for a given norm considers whether it would represent an improvement over the status quo in life prospects.

The first five of the fifteen chapters concentrate on the main principle. Chapter 2 discusses the general kind of reasoning that the main principle justifies, ground-level moral thought. Chapter 3 articulates the main principle and argues that it is not vulnerable to the objections traditionally raised against utilitarianism. Chapter 4 focuses on key concepts included in the main principle, such as well-being and equity. Chapter 5 considers puzzles surrounding the metaphysics and epistemology of objective value, and argues that the main principle provides resources for solving such puzzles.

The next ten chapters apply the main principle, demonstrating how it provides a consequentialist grounding of human rights that is superior to the nonconsequentialist alternatives. In Talbott's view, the consequentialist account is superior because it can (1) generate the same list of rights as the nonconsequentialist; (2) provide better resources for specifying the contours of such rights; and (3) solve puzzles that he claims nonconsequentialist accounts generate.

Chapter 6 argues for security rights, which are rights that protect against harms to one's person or property. If a government does not protect individuals against basic harms it cannot equitably promote life prospects. Such security rights are more robust than libertarian natural rights, Talbott claims, because they include a right to protection against basic harms, not just a right against such harms. Chapter 7 looks at autonomy rights and argues that such rights solve an epistemic problem among individuals and groups. Chapter 8 considers the specific autonomy rights of freedom of expression and the press, demonstrating the line of reasoning articulated in chapter 7. Chapter 9 discusses economic rights, including property and contract rights, and their role in solving the collective action problem of productive investment, which is "the problem of motivating people to productively invest their time to make improvements in the world" (p. 204).

Chapter 10 looks at democratic rights and argues that, coupled with autonomy rights, such rights solve the reliable feedback problem (how governments can assess how well their policies are doing in promoting equitable life prospects) and the appropriate responsiveness problem (how governments can determine the appropriate way to respond to information regarding how their policies are doing). Chapter 11 argues for opportunity rights and social insurance rights as necessary for equitably promoting life prospects. Chapter 12 articulates and defends what Talbott calls the most reliable judgment standard for soft legal paternalism. The most reliable judgment standard states that "legal paternalism is soft when it is reasonable to believe it is part of a policy that would be endorsed by the target's most reliable judgments" (p. 301). Chapter 14 considers objections and replies. Chapter 15 is the conclusion.

To illustrate the general line of argument Talbott advances, consider his argument for autonomy rights. He defines autonomy as being a "reliable judge of one's own good" and having the ability to have such judgments direct one's actions (p. 172). Autonomy rights help to develop and protect both capacities. In chapter 8 he considers the autonomy rights of freedom of expression and freedom of the press. He develops a Millian consequentialist argument for these rights, then compares this analysis with that of the nonconsequentialist.

Talbott argues that the free give-and-take of opinion and expression, which the rights to freedom of expression and the press protect, are needed to equitably promote well-being. First, the formulation of rational true beliefs depends on the free give-and-take of opinion. Echoing Mill, Talbott argues that all of our beliefs are fallible. The only way to progress toward the truth is to subject our views to the critical scrutiny of others. Talbott also suggests that Google and Wikipedia demonstrate the reliability of the process of the free give-and-take of opinion. The development of true rational beliefs is important for human well-being, in part because the successful pursuit of our goals depends on an accurate understanding of what will in fact enable us to pursue our goals. It is also critical that individuals formulate correct views about in what their good consists.

Freedom of expression, Talbott argues, is critical in developing views about what is good for oneself. Such freedom creates a space for conducting experiments in living. Individuals can learn from such "experiments," both in their successes and their failures, and, if they so choose, adopt those "experiments" that are successful or pursue new experiments. A critical assumption underpinning this argument is the claim of first-person authority, according to which "given appropriate background conditions (specified by the autonomy rights, including freedom of expression), normal adult human beings are reliable judges of what is good for them, and generally more reliable than other people" (p. 189). This is why it is important for individuals themselves, rather than others, to be free to judge what is best for them and how best to pursue it.

Talbott argues that his account of autonomy rights is superior to that of nonconsequentialists such as Rawls. First, his account does not depend on a distinction between reasonable and unreasonable views. According to Talbott, this distinction has unnecessarily hampered efforts to justify human rights by leading theorists influenced by Rawls to conclude that human rights must be subject to an overlapping consensus of reasonable views. However,

there is a deep problem with the whole idea of using the existence of reasonable disagreement as a test for whether something is a human right. The problem is that even the concept of reasonable disagreement is one on which there is and always will be reasonable disagreement (p. 180).

The fact that there is disagreement about what counts as reasonable means few rights will ever be justified. There is substantial disagreement, for example, about Rawls's particular conception of reasonable. There is also "lots of reasonable disagreement" on whether, for example, women should have many of the conventionally recognized human rights Talbott claims. Talbott asks, "Do we really want to insist that those who, on the basis of their religious beliefs, deny women most of the rights on the UN Universal Declaration of Human rights are unreasonable?" (p. 180).

Second, Talbott argues that his analysis provides better resources for responding to particular cases, such as whether subversive intolerant advocacy should be protected. Such advocacy consists in encouraging the overthrow of a government where the new form of government will not protect freedom of expression. According to Talbott, Rawls, rightly in Talbott's view, wants to support the protection of such expression but lacks the theoretical resources to do so. All parties in the original position would agree to tolerate those who are also willing to extend toleration to others. This provides the grounds for liberty of conscience. However, the grounds for such a right suggest that it should be extended only to those willing to be tolerant. Moreover, in Political Liberalism Rawls asserts that communities must try to contain unreasonable doctrines so that justice is not undermined, which Talbott interprets as suggesting that such doctrines be suppressed by being made illegal. In Talbott's view,

the main problem with Rawls's theory is that it is an ideal theory… . Rawls's theory does not have the resources to systematically address questions about nonideal theory in which not everyone is so cooperative. Intolerant subversive activity is an issue for nonideal theory (p. 195).

By contrast, Talbott presents a straightforward analysis of this case. As Rawls himself notes, intolerant subversive activity can provide a way for governments to identify and respond to legitimate grievances that typically motivate such advocacy. There may be exceptions in which there would be a clear and present danger should such advocacy continue, but Talbott claims that this will be rare and should be conceptualized in terms of constitutional crises.

Although I find Talbott's account of the consequentialist grounds for autonomy rights compelling, I have concerns with the comparative case that Talbott makes. Take the first criticism of Rawls, based on the problems associated with trying to distinguish reasonable from unreasonable views. The example Talbott uses to illustrate his point fails to convince. He asserts, without argument, that there is reasonable disagreement about whether women should enjoy many of the rights covered by the UN list of human rights. In Talbott's terminology, reasonable disagreement means that there are good reasons supporting views both for and against such rights. It is unclear what he takes to be the good reasons that support the denial of human rights to women. Talbott never spells out the standards for distinguishing good versus bad reasons for supporting a particular view. He also never spells out what the reasons are in this particular case, gesturing toward the potential religious grounds for such denials (which presumably are the grounds to which the Taliban, for example, appeals) without considering the controversy surrounding the legitimacy of such interpretations. Moreover, Talbott ultimately relies on a rhetorical appeal. His discussion of the toleration of intolerant subversive advocacy rests, in my view, on a misunderstanding of the role of nonideal theory in the Rawlsian picture. The ideal theory provides a framework or reference point from which we can deal with nonideal questions in a principled way. Thus it is not clear that the failure of the original position to ground or justify liberty of conscience for intolerant subversives (whose views would not be included in the original position) demonstrates that the extension of constitutional rights to such groups could not be grounded.

These particular concerns reflect a more general weakness in Talbott's comparative case, which undermines his case against the nonconsequentialist. Talbott covers an astonishing range of nonconsequentialist theories throughout the volume, discussing the arguments for particular rights advanced by figures including Ronald Dworkin, J├╝rgen Habermas, Robert Nozick, John Rawls, and Judith Jarvis Thompson. However, the breadth of his discussion comes at the expense of the depth needed to demonstrate the superiority of the consequentialist alternative. In the first place, specific criticisms against particular arguments proceed too quickly to be convincing, as the example of the rights of women illustrates. Moreover, the diverse range of theories considered leads to a misleading picture of nonconsequentialist views.

Talbott claims that nonconsequentialist theories lack a meta-principle of the kind he advocates, and instead offer only ground-level norms and principles. The contrast between the ground-level and meta-level is not entirely clear, but the ground-level seems to consist strictly of general principles and norms as well as moral judgments about particular actions. The rationale or justification for such norms or the explanation for why the principle "coercion is wrong" is correct is not part of ground-level morality. Such a rationale is precisely what the main principle provides. Talbott does not consider a nonconsequentialist meta-principle and suggests that there is none. However, it seems far from obvious that nonconsequentialists lack a set of unifying moral concerns that provide the shared basis for a nonconsequentialist meta-principle. By considering one or two nonconsequentialist theorists in detail, Talbott could have identified such shared grounds and then compared the main principle against such alternatives. Finally, Talbott argues compellingly that there are consequentialist grounds for robust and inalienable rights that guarantee the stringency with which rights will be protected. However, this stringency still has an empirical basis at its foundation. Talbott does not respond to one consequentialist puzzle that nonconsequentialists seem best set to resolve: why there are principled and not simply empirical contingent grounds for justifying rights. In my view, had Talbott narrowed his scope and addressed this issue, the result would have been a much clearer sense of why the consequentialist grounds are superior.

Despite these concerns, Human Rights and Human Well-being provides a compelling and well-developed account of a consequentialist theory of human rights that should be read by all those interested in human rights, consequentialists and nonconsequentialists alike.