Human Rights, Legitimacy, and the Use of Force

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Allen Buchanan, Human Rights, Legitimacy, and the Use of Force, Oxford University Press, 2010, 332pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195389654.

Reviewed by Helena de Bres, Wellesley College


 This richly rewarding book brings together thirteen articles that Allen Buchanan has published over the past ten years on the topics of the content and justification of human rights, the legitimacy of international law-making institutions and the use of force in international relations. The articles collected here together constitute a major contribution to the underdeveloped field of the philosophy of international law, a field in which Buchanan has been a leading light over the past decade. The philosophy of international law, as distinct from international political philosophy, is characterized by close attention to the norms currently embedded in treaty-based and customary international law, and to the moral standing of the institutions through which those norms are specified and interpreted.

While Buchanan would, I think, accept this characterization, he would also warn against exaggerating the distinction between such topics and those that animate neighboring fields, such as the ever-expanding body of philosophical work on global distributive justice. This is because one of the central take-home points of Buchanan's book is the need to embed philosophical theorizing about international law within a more comprehensive moral-political theory. This theme is one thread in a more general resistance on Buchanan's part to what he sees as the excessive compartmentalization of recent moral and political philosophy: the sequestering of theorizing about domestic justice from theorizing about global justice; the tendency of work on human rights, institutional legitimacy and the morality of war to proceed in isolation from each other; and -- a point that receives special emphasis -- the failure of philosophers to integrate their analysis of moral norms with an empirically robust comparative evaluation of the institutions that might specify and enforce those norms. The value of this refreshing book lies as much in its function as a general model of how to fruitfully escape these tendencies as in the many penetrating insights that its individual chapters offer into specific questions of international morality.

The first section of the book focuses on human rights, a topic to which, as Buchanan notes, mainstream political philosophers have until late paid surprisingly little attention. The first two chapters involve intensive critical exegesis of Rawls' Law of Peoples. The first examines the way in which Rawls' use of the political liberal notion of "reasonableness" functions (for Buchanan, illegitimately) to truncate his list of human rights, and the second critiques Rawls' rejection of the conventional idea that human rights are grounded in characteristics that all humans share. These articles constitute an important contribution to intra-Rawlsian debates about how to extend political liberalism to the international sphere, but the clarification that they provide is arguably just as useful for those of us who are not Rawlsians, and who therefore (perhaps I am projecting) can't always muster the sustained effort ourselves to attempt to understand the more obscure passages in that frequently obscure book.

That said, I found the most interesting chapters in this section to be those in which Buchanan develops his own alternative conception of human rights, which he terms the "Modest Objectivist View". On this attractive conception, human rights specify the conditions necessary to protect basic human interests against standard threats to those interests. The view is modest because it focuses on the requirements for a minimally decent life; it is objectivist because it grounds human rights in morally relevant features that all humans are assumed to possess. Buchanan is highly sensitive to the risk of parochialism involved in the task of specifying the interests and threats that underlie human rights. He argues, however, that the proper response to this risk is not to retreat to relativism or extreme minimalism about human rights, but instead to work to ensure that the institutions that articulate human rights possess certain "epistemic virtues" -- for instance, an ability to take into account changing factual circumstances and to include and accommodate diverse perspectives (pp. 89-91). The key methodological point here is that political philosophers cannot answer the parochialism challenge purely by means of abstract moral reasoning; instead they need to get their hands dirty, by thinking in a serious and empirically informed way about institutional design.

This theme carries through into the first two chapters of the second section of the book, which contains four essays on the legitimacy of international law-making institutions. The first two chapters propose a global public standard for the legitimacy of global governance institutions, essential to which is the idea that such institutions "must possess certain epistemic virtues that facilitate the ongoing critical revision of [their] goals, through interaction with agents and organizations outside the institution" (p. 106). Buchanan considers renewed attention to the relationship between justice and legitimacy (roughly, the right to rule) to be the second great revolution in political theory that Rawls has bequeathed us (p. 13) and these chapters do an excellent job of further clarifying that relationship by fleshing out what legitimacy might substantively require in the domain of international law. The second two chapters in this section explore the challenge to the legitimacy of international law that is posed by the potential conflict between it and domestic democracy, the first chapter by means of a critical review of the rational choice position taken in Eric Posner and Jack Goldsmith's The Limits of International Law, the second by means of a systematic examination of four distinct claims of incompatibility. Buchanan concludes that, although charges of inherent conflict are overblown, cosmopolitans committed to the project of bringing international relations under the rule of law have underestimated the scope for tensions between this goal and constitutional democracy, and need to address this neglected issue if their accounts of global justice are to be persuasive.

The final section of the book treats several central problems in contemporary philosophical/legal scholarship on the morality of war. Chapter 9 addresses the neglected question of which conditions must be satisfied if state leaders are to be able to justify "pure" humanitarian intervention (i.e., the kind that works against the interests of the intervening state) to their own citizens, as opposed to other states or international actors. Buchanan argues that, on what he takes to be the dominant philosophical understanding of the moral function of the state -- according to which "the state is a discretionary association for the mutual advantage of its members" (p. 204) -- such interventions are impermissible. He then suggests that, on closer examination, this view of the state turns out to be incoherent, and advocates replacing it with an alternative view, according to which the state should be viewed in part as an instrument for promoting global justice. This alternative position has what Buchanan considers to be the attractive effect of rendering humanitarian intervention not only permissible but obligatory in certain circumstances.

Chapters 11 and 12 consider the permissibility of preventive war and forcible democratization. The structure of argument here is similar to that which Buchanan employs in the earlier chapters on human rights. Departing from the traditional norm according to which war is permissible only in response to actual or imminent attack involves serious risks of error and abuse on the part of intervening states. However, Buchanan argues, these risks can in principle be alleviated by the creation of new institutions, such as a "multilateral accountability regime" (p. 286) that subjects intervening states to an ex post evaluation of their actions and has the power to impose costs in the event of a negative assessment.

Chapter 10 is the most comprehensive and accessible attack that I have yet come across on Realism (the position that states are morally free to direct their foreign policy exclusively in accordance with the national interest), and would be an excellent addition to an undergraduate or graduate syllabus on global justice. The final chapter is a well-chosen capstone to the book as a whole, bringing together a number of issues treated separately in earlier chapters, including the moral value of the rule of law, the nature of legitimacy, the relevance of state consent, the importance of "epistemic responsibility" as a condition of reasonableness, and the need for philosophers to consider alternative "packages" of norms and institutions. This chapter considers another barely explored question: that of whether it is permissible to violate existing international law with the aim of ameliorating the system of international law (a question to which Buchanan offers a qualified "yes"). A particularly valuable feature of this third section of the book is its engagement with real-world public controversies, including the NATO intervention in Kosovo (Chapter 13) and the Bush administration's decision to go to war with Iraq (Chapter 11).

The general moral vision for international law and politics that emerges from these papers is one of considerable attractiveness. Buchanan displays a strong commitment to the project of extending the reach and strength of global governance institutions, tempered by an equally robust sense of the moral risks and practical difficulties involved in that project. His approach to the issues that he discusses is not mired in the stale dichotomies between cosmopolitan and statist positions on global justice or consequentialist and deontological positions on ethics that litter much contemporary work on international justice, which should increase the breadth of its appeal.

The book's general picture of philosophy's relation both to other disciplines and to public debate is similarly appealing. In the task of developing norms for the creation of a legitimate and just international order, philosophy is to play an essential but restricted role. Philosophers are urged to abandon their habit of constructing "a list of abstract norms to be supported or debunked by free-floating philosophical argumentation" (p. 96), and instead draw on the resources of social science as well as the views of those whose lives are at stake in this project.

The way in which Buchanan philosophizes will also be familiar and congenial to those who work in analytic political philosophy. Buchanan's writing throughout is characterized by careful, serious attention to detail. He frequently operates by means of exhaustive surveys of the argumentative terrain, such as his examination of the four distinct arguments for the incompatibility of international law with democracy in Chapter 8 (pp. 184-193), and the four different Rawlsian arguments for human rights minimalism discussed in Chapter 2 (pp. 33-48). (As usual, the price one pays for the clarity thus achieved is that the book is not a summer beach read; the prose is sometimes burdened by digressions, a plodding structure and a fondness for acronyms.) The conclusion of such sustained analyses is generally balanced and moderate. A characteristic Buchanan move is to argue that: 1) yes, contra some theorists, there is a tension between x and y, but, contra some other theorists, not a strict incompatibility; 2) we need to get clearer on the nature of the tension at issue in order to resolve it; and 3) this will involve reframing the debate, in part by situating it within a broader normative and empirical perspective. (See, e.g., Chapters 8, 12 and 13.)

Perhaps the necessary flip side of all of this attractiveness and moderation is that the conclusions of the essays collected here are not always of the kind to set one's soul on fire. Several of the theses that Buchanan defends -- that human rights must have some connection to human nature (contra Rawls), that the rule of international law is not inherently incompatible with domestic democracy, that preventive war cannot be categorically ruled out -- are, when stated in a self-standing fashion, not startling. Some of the opponents that Buchanan selects for himself -- Posner and Goldsmith, Realists -- will come across (to philosophers, if not to legal scholars or theorists of international relations) as too easy a target. In addition, the passage of time since the original publication of these papers has remedied some of the gaps in the philosophical literature that Buchanan identifies. The concluding sentence of Chapter 3, for instance, which states that philosophers must "abandon the assumption that one can develop an adequate theory of equality for the domestic case without theorizing about global justice" (p. 68) reads as somewhat dated, now that every theorist of domestic justice and his dog seem to be developing a position on global justice.

A more troubling contributor to the unsurprising nature of some of Buchanan's conclusions is the minimalist moral agenda that Buchanan sets himself. There is a striking lack in these papers of the egalitarian impulse that animates other self-described "cosmopolitans". According to Buchanan's Modest Objectivist View, honoring human rights requires that everyone have the opportunity, although not the equal opportunity, for a minimally decent life (p. 55). This requirement then becomes the central moral touchstone guiding assessments of the legitimacy of global governance institutions (p. 116) and the core of Buchanan's critiques of Realism (Chapter 10) and the "discretionary association view of the state" (Chapter 9). Achieving the universal protection of human rights, thus understood, is not a moral goal to be sniffed at. But it quite clearly falls short of the robust concern with relative (as opposed to absolute) position that characterizes the views of philosophical egalitarians.

Buchanan argues in section 4 of Chapter 3 that the minimalism of human rights is, in principle, compatible with the egalitarianism defended by prominent philosophers of equality, once we appeal to the distinctions between domestic and global principles of justice, and ideal and non-ideal theory (pp. 65-66). But Buchanan provides nothing here in the way of a substantive explanation for why global principles of justice actually should differ from domestic principles, or why concerns of feasibility really do count against more extensive ambitions at present. The point I am making here can be interpreted in a Buchanan-esque light. Coming to a definitive assessment of Buchanan's position on the content of human rights, and on the role that they play in the legitimacy of international institutions and justifications for the use of force in international relations, is difficult in the absence of a broader theory of global justice and global politics in which to situate that position. Without that broader theory, worries will linger that Buchanan has set his sights too short.

Human Rights, Legitimacy and the Use of Force mounts a convincing case for the claim that the three topics featured in its title cannot be fruitfully theorized in isolation from each other. Along the way it raises many questions that have hitherto been unrecognized or under-addressed by philosophers. Can a commitment to the rule of law require violating existing international law? Whether or not a state's engagement in humanitarian intervention violates the rights of other states, does it violate the rights of the state's own citizens? How might the character of global governance institutions serve to justify moral norms rather than to simply enforce them? It is hard to imagine anyone who finds such problems compelling coming away from this excellent book without a barrage of new insights and a renewed sense of the extent and scope of work that remains to be done in this exciting field.