Hume on Art, Emotion, and Superstition: A Critical Study of the Four Dissertations

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Amyas Merivale, Hume on Art, Emotion, and Superstition: A Critical Study of the Four Dissertations, Routledge, 2019, 240pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138351462.

Reviewed by Mark Collier, University of Minnesota, Morris


Amyas Merivale offers the first book-length treatment of Hume's Four Dissertations (1757), which is comprised of the Natural History of Religion, Dissertation on the Passions, Of Tragedy, and Of the Standard of Taste. The Four Dissertations has been largely overshadowed, if not totally eclipsed, by Hume's earlier philosophical writings. Merivale's goal is to change these attitudes about the relative significance of the Four Dissertations. He defends two main theses. The first is that the texts included in the Four Dissertations should be viewed as a "unified set", deliberately organized around a central theme of the passions, rather than as an arbitrary collection of texts (17). The second, more controversial, claim is that the Four Dissertations develops and improves on Hume's philosophy of emotion in Book Two of the Treatise. Indeed, Merivale maintains that the Four Dissertations should be regarded as Hume's Third Enquiry concerning the Passions.

Merivale makes a convincing case for the first thesis: there is, without any doubt, thematic unity among the various texts that comprise the Four Dissertations. Of the Passions offers a systematic account of the nature and operations of the emotions. The Natural History of Religion appeals to the emotions of hope and fear to account for ontological commitment to gods and spirits. Of Tragedy appeals to a mixture of emotions to explain the puzzling fact that we enjoy performances depicting the pain and suffering of others. Of the Standard of Taste appeals to the uniformity of our emotional responses to artwork to resolve aesthetic disagreements. Emotions are evidently the centerpiece, then, of Hume's account of art, emotion, and superstition.

Merivale's argument for the second and bolder thesis, however, is less convincing. He begins his case for this interpretation by examining what he sees as the most pronounced development of Hume's views: Hume's abandonment of psychological egoism and embrace of psychological altruism. On Merivale's reading, Hume is an unrepentant motivational hedonist in Book Two of the Treatise: all of our desires necessarily arise from the prospect of our own pleasure and pain (53). But Hume breaks from this doctrine and embraces motivational pluralism after encountering Bishop Butler's Sermons (71).

There are notable difficulties, however, with this line of interpretation. In Book Two of the Treatise, Hume describes the passion of pity as "an uneasiness . . . arising from the misery of others" and a "desire of the happiness of another" (57). Merivale asserts that this affective concern for the welfare of others arises "straightforwardly enough, through an application of self-love": we sympathetically feel the pain of others and are subsequently motivated to alleviate their suffering in order to make ourselves feel better (ibid.). But Merivale offers no textual support for this egoistic rendition of pity and compassion. And if we take these passages at face value, Hume appears to be asserting that we desire the happiness of others as an ultimate goal; he never claims that this desire is treated in practical deliberation as a means to a further self-regarding end. It is not clear why reading Butler's Sermons would have been necessary, moreover, to sow doubts in Hume's mind about the plausibility of psychological altruism: Hume was presumably influenced by Hutcheson's earlier critique of Hobbesian egoism.

Merivale's provocative claim that the Four Dissertations should be viewed as a development of Hume's earlier philosophy of emotions runs into further trouble when he turns to the Natural History of Religion. It is difficult to understand how this later text can be seen as an improvement on Hume's presentation in Book Two of the Treatise, for the simple reason that Hume does not examine the natural foundations of belief in gods and spirits in that earlier work. It is fair to say that the Natural History of Religion appeals to psychological principles originally presented in the Treatise; but it cannot be seen as a replacement text in the same way that the First Enquiry might be viewed as the mature successor to Book One of the Treatise.

The same point can be made about Of the Standard of Taste: this text cannot improve on Hume's earlier account because Hume does not provide an examination of aesthetic disagreement in the Treatise. And a similar worry arises in the context of the essay Of Tragedy. Hume appeals in this work to a psychological principle -- by which one emotion is converted into another -- that was originally presented in Book Two of the Treatise. Hume modifies this principle in the Four Dissertations and applies it to the puzzle of tragedy. But the subject of tragedy does not appear in Book Two. There is once again no sustained explanation in the earlier work, therefore, for these later essays to develop or improve on. The analogy with the first two Enquiries appears to have broken down. Hume's Enquiries offer a substantial reworking and reshaping of material presented in the Treatise: but the same cannot be said of his later essays on religion and aesthetics.

One would expect Merivale to be on safer grounds in his examination of Hume's Dissertation on the Passions. This text involves a radical makeover of content originally presented in Book Two of the Treatise. Merivale maintains that Hume changes his mind, moreover, about the essential nature of emotions. He reads the Hume of the Treatise as a feeling theorist who is committed to the view that emotions are constituted solely by their distinctive phenomenological qualia. But Merivale reads the Hume of the Four Dissertations as cognitivist: the intentional objects of emotions are intrinsic rather than extrinsic features of these mental states. Passions such as pride are complex, in other words, and are constituted both by their characteristic feels and their intentional objects (139). The textual support for this interpretation, Merivale admits, is rather thin, and he leans heavily on the fact that Hume removed his explicit endorsement of feeling theory in his later writings on the emotions. But one must wonder whether it is fair to appeal to such deletions: after all, Hume removed almost 90% of the material from the Book Two writings on the passions. It is hard to discern whether such changes amount to space saving measures, intended merely to ease exposition, or whether Hume has actually turned his back on his earlier commitments.

Merivale is a sympathetic reader who attempts to defend Hume's later writings on emotion, art, and religion from a variety of contemporary criticisms. But it should be noted that he stops short of providing a complete defense of Hume's positions. Consider, for example, Of the Standard of Taste. Merivale offers a "partial defense" of Hume's attempt to resolve widespread aesthetic disagreements (193). He believes that Hume's account can be internally defended from a host of recent objections; but he acknowledges that he is not in a position to externally defend Hume's assumption that core aesthetic values are grounded in principles of human nature, since evaluating this claim would require one to take interdisciplinary research from cognitive science into consideration (220). But one might worry that this interpretative strategy puts an end to the matter right when one has reached its crux. If Hume is offering experimental claims about the workings of human emotions, then one can only fully defend his position by taking our best empirical studies into consideration. Merivale recognizes that a complete defense of Hume's solution to the puzzle of tragedy would require similar explorations into the neighboring field of experimental aesthetics (188). The same might be said about Hume's speculative proposals in the Four Dissertations concerning the psychological foundations of religious belief.

Merivale regards Book Two of the Treatise as a "first draft" for the Four Dissertations and he boldly asserts that his later writings on the passions are "better" than his earlier ones (228). There is reason to suspect, as we have seen, that he has not sufficiently established this controversial claim. But this objection does not ultimately diminish the overall value of this critical study. There is still a great deal to admire about this book. Merivale is surely right that the Four Dissertations is a unified work, for example, and that one cannot properly understand or evaluate Hume's views on aesthetics and religion independently of his hilosophy of emotion. Merivale also provides the reader with an exceptionally clear, systematic overview of Hume's arguments in the Four Dissertations. He does an excellent job contextualizing Hume's writings in their historical contexts, providing useful overviews of the positions of lesser known authors such as Trenchard, Bolingbroke, and DuBos.

Merivale also does a fine job distinguishing his own account from a wide variety of alternative contemporary interpretations of Hume's positions on emotion, art, and religion. These sections illuminate the Four Dissertations in a way that has never been done before. Merivale's book is a valuable resource, therefore, for professional scholars new to these areas and for students interested in pursuing the secondary literature. It provides a helpful introduction to the various texts included in the Four Dissertations: a unified collection of writings with enormous philosophical value, even if they should not be considered rivals to the Treatise.