Hume on Motivation and Virtue

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Charles R. Pigden (ed.), Hume on Motivation and Virtue, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 303pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230205277.

Reviewed by Karl Schafer, University of Pittsburgh



In 2003, Charles Pigden organized a conference on “Hume, Motivation, Is, and Ought” at Otago University in New Zealand. Plainly, the resulting conference was a great success, and the papers presented there (with some additions) are now being published in the form of — not one — but two separate volumes on Hume’s practical philosophy. The first volume focuses on Hume’s views about reason, motivation, and virtue, and the second focuses on Hume’s discussion of the alleged gap between “is” and “ought”.

The first of these is the subject of this review. The essays contained therein form an impressive collection, including pieces by many leading Hume scholars, as well as a number of prominent ethicists of a broadly Humean orientation. The topics covered by these essays include, but are by no means exhausted by: non-cognitivism (Richard Joyce, Charles Pigden, Michael Smith), the “Humean” theory of motivation (Joyce, Norva Lo, Pigden, Smith, Constantine Sandis, Stephen Finlay , Kent Hurtig), the nature of instrumental rationality (Finlay), the role of desires in moral epistemology (Graham Oddie), the relationship between Hume and Kant (Herlinde Pauer-Studer, Luke Russell), Hume’s account of the virtues (Christine Swanton, Annette Baier), and his account of justice (Rosalind Hursthouse).

In short, the volume is filled with essays that deserve careful discussion. Of course, it is impossible in a review of this length to give more than the most cursory attention to most of them. Thus, I’m going to focus the rest of this review on several of these essays that I’ve selected for more detailed consideration. I’ve chosen the essays in question because they struck me as especially interesting and because they seem to me to give one a good sense of the overall flavor of the work within this volume. But while my choice is not entirely arbitrary, it is important not to make too much of it. All of the essays in this volume could profitably be given the same attention.

1. Pigden and Sandis on the Inertness of Reason

One of the central issues in many of the volume’s essays is the question of how best to understand Hume’s views about the relationship between reason and motivation — and, in particular, the question of how Hume’s famous claim that reason is “inert” is best understood.

This claim is often read to imply that all beliefs (or other purely cognitive states) are motivationally inert. But as a number of the authors in this collection quite correctly stress, this fits poorly with Hume’s actual discussion of the ability of beliefs to generate motivation. For example, Hume’s discussion in T 1.3.10’s “Of the Influence of Belief” strongly suggests that Hume thinks that at least some beliefs about pleasure and pain can directly cause new passions, even in the absence of a pre-existing Humean passion of the relevant sort. In their contributions to the volume, both Charles Pigden and Constantine Sandis take examples like this one to show that the claim that reason is inert cannot plausibly be read as a claim about the inertness of all beliefs. Instead, they interpret this as a claim about some beliefs as opposed to others — namely, as the claim that beliefs that are derived from (or produced by) reason are motivationally inert.

Given the common presumption that the inertness of reason should be understood in terms of the inertness of some set of beliefs, this is a very natural way of responding to cases like those discussed in T 1.3.10. But nonetheless it seems to me to miss the real point Hume means to be making here. Remember that reason, for Hume, is a belief-forming faculty — namely, the faculty of forming beliefs via demonstrative and probable reasoning. Thus, when Hume claims that reason is inert, he is making a claim about the inability of this faculty to generate new passions, volitions, and actions — not a claim about the inability of either beliefs in general or the beliefs generated by this faculty to do so. In short, when Hume says that reason is inert, he simply means that it is impossible for any process of reasoning to terminate in a new passion, volition, or action. Or, in other words, his claim is just what it seems to be on its face: a claim about the inertness of the faculty of reason — as opposed to a claim about the inertness of this faculty’s products.

This is particularly important because, contrary to what Pigden and Sandis suggest, beliefs about pleasure and pain appear to retain their motivational significance for Hume whether or not they are the product of immediate sensation or more abstract reasoning. For Hume, so long as such beliefs have the relevant level of force and vivacity, they will be perfectly “ert” motivationally.1 So while Pigden and Sandis’ reading goes some way towards accommodating these sorts of passages, it does not go nearly far enough.

This is a point of no small import, for when we read Hume’s claims about the “ertness” of morals and the “inertness” of reason as claims about our faculties, these claims no longer appear to be claims about the ability or inability of some or all of our beliefs to generate passions, volitions, and actions. Rather, we can recognize that what is at issue here is the quite separate question of the relationship between our moral faculty and our faculty of reason. In effect, Hume is arguing here that our moral faculty cannot be understood as a particular manifestation of our faculty of reason — for the moral faculty is capable of generating new passions, volitions, and actions, while the faculty of reason (operating on its own) is not. Thus, we must conceive of our moral faculty not as a form of moral or practical reason, but rather as a sort of moral sense. And this, as noted above, should not be understood to imply anything directly about the motivational efficacy of moral or non-moral beliefs.

2. Finlay’s Discussion of the Instrumental Norm

In his provocative essay, “Against All Reason? Skepticism about the Instrumental Norm”, Stephen Finlay argues that while instrumentalism is true of reasons for action, the instrumental norm that demands that we will the necessary means to our ends is not a normative requirement.

Finlay claims that this is Hume’s view of the issue, something that I am skeptical of. But whether or not Finlay’s view of Hume is correct, the argument he presents for this view deserves serious consideration. In effect, Finlay’s argument is that any plausible construal of the instrumental norm will have the following shape:

IN (For all agents x, ends y, actions z, and times t) ((x intends at t to achieve y and x at t believes z to be the necessary performable means for achieving y) > (x ought to intend to do z or cease intending to achieve y)).

Although there are some potential issues with this formulation, I’ll take it for granted here, since I don’t think these issues are central to Finlay’s argument. Instead, this argument rests on the claim that any plausible formulation of the instrumental norm will fail to satisfy what he calls “the possible violation criterion”. In other words, Finlay hopes to show that any such formulation of the instrumental norm fails to meet the demand that it must be possible to violate any true normative requirement.

A criterion of this sort is fairly widely accepted today, but I must say that I’m personally rather skeptical that anything like it is part of our ordinary understanding of normativity. But even if we accept this criterion, I’m skeptical that Finlay’s argument succeeds.

In its essentials, Finlay ’s argument proceeds as follows. Finlay notes, quite correctly to my mind, that when we will some end, we are in effect intending to bring this end about. And in intending this, we are intending to perform whatever is necessary to bring the end about. That is, in willing the end, we are already willing the necessary means to this end, under the mode of presentation “the means that are necessary to bring about the end in question”.

This means that, as Kant claims, there is a sense in which willing the necessary means follows analytically from willing the end. Finlay hopes to use this fact to show that IN is in fact impossible to violate in the manner that the possible violation criterion demands. But, as Finlay is well aware, the point noted above is not on its own sufficient to establish this claim. For IN tells us to will the necessary means to our end, not under the mode of presentation “necessary means to our end”, but instead under some more precise mode of presentation (e.g., as z). So while it may be impossible to will the end without willing the “necessary means” under the mode of presentation “the necessary means”, this does not mean that it is impossible to violate IN.

Finlay attempts to close this gap by arguing that the intention to achieve y, when paired with the belief that z is the necessary means to doing so, is itself an intention to achieve z. In defense of this claim, he writes the following, focusing on a case in which he is aiming to spot a kitten:

So long as I have this belief in the necessity of going through the event of my turning on the light in order to reach the event of spotting the kitten, my deliberative efforts to perform the necessary means to spotting the kitten will of necessity track the goal of turning on the light - which simply means (given the identification of intending with tracking) that so long as I have this means-belief, my intention to perform the necessary means is an intention to turn on the light. (164)

This is an intriguing argument, but I doubt that it can succeed. First of all, I am skeptical of Finlay’s (rather externalist) claim that the content of an intention can be fixed solely in terms of the states of the world that it tracks. Even if we take this model of intending on board, however, Finlay’s argument seems to me to miss the point of the instrumental norm. After all, as Finlay himself acknowledges, the intention to spot the kitten will only track the goal of turning on the light in the context of the relevant belief about what the means necessary to this end are. In particular, it will only track this further goal so long as it is “put together” with this belief in the right way. But what is it to put this intention and this belief together in the right way? Well, it is just to draw the relevant inference from them, and form the intention to turn on the light as such. Thus, the intention to spot the kitten will only track the action of turning on the light insofar as one draws the inference that IN demands of one. And so the intention to spot the kitten, even in the context of the relevant means-belief, should not be identified with the intention to turn on the light. Rather, the first of these intentions will only track the action of turning on the light insofar as one draws the inferences that IN demands. While it may be irrational to fail to draw these inferences, nothing so far has been said to show that it is impossible. Thus, even given Finlay’s assumptions, it remains possible for IN to satisfy the possible violation criterion.

3. Concluding Remarks

As noted above, the three essays I have discussed here are only a small sample of the rich work on display within this volume. Among the other essays, I found Richard Joyce’s discussion of non-cognitivism and Graham Oddie’s discussion of the possibilities for combining a Humean moral epistemology with a robust realism about value particularly thought-provoking. And, of course, anyone interested in Hume’s account of virtue will find a great deal of interest in the exchange between Christine Swanton and Annette Baier on this issue. In the end, as noted above, all of the essays in this volume repay close attention. Taken as a whole, this volume testifies to the continued relevance of Hume’s thought to contemporary ethical theorizing of nearly every sort. It is well worth reading for anyone interested in these issues.

1 See Rachel Cohen’s recent Hume’s Morality (Oxford: Oxford UP, 2008) for a very helpful discussion of some of these issues.