Hume, Reason and Morality: A Legacy of Contradiction

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Sophie Botros, Hume, Reason and Morality: A Legacy of Contradiction, Routledge, 2006, 253pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415331803.

Reviewed by Tamra Frei, Michigan State University


How are we best to interpret and utilize David Hume's highly influential arguments in Book III, Part I, Section I of A Treatise of Human Nature, which are meant to establish that moral judgments are not derived from reason? This is the central question of the book, which is divided into two parts. In Part I, Hume's Practicality Argument, Botros carefully examines the passages in which Hume advances, what she calls, the practicality argument -- the conclusion of which is that moral distinctions are not founded on reason. This is a relatively simple argument with just two premises. However, one of Botros' main conclusions is that contrary to most contemporary philosophers -- both scholars of Hume and meta-ethicists -- the text supports two, rather than one reading of the argument. In Part II, The Practicality Argument Today, Botros considers how the conclusions reached in Part I bear on contemporary meta-ethical debates concerning cognitivism and non-cognitivism and internal and external reasons.

On the standard, or, as Botros calls it, 'moderate' interpretation of 3.1.1, Hume advances only one argument, although he states it several times and in different ways. In the first premise, Hume asserts that moral judgments influence actions, and in the second that reason alone does not influence actions. The conclusion is that moral judgments are not based on reason (27). Understood in this 'moderate' way, Hume intends to limit, but not rule out entirely, a role for reason in the production of action. Hume is understood as claiming that reason cannot on its own move us to act, but it can do so with the help of desire. On this reading, the argument is taken as support for the Humean belief-desire theory of action and the meta-ethical position known as non-cognitivism.

In Chapter Two, Botros convincingly argues that there are two problems with the 'moderate' reading. First, she argues that the moderate reading of the argument is not valid and that a valid interpretation of the argument that coheres with Hume's text cannot be given. Why is the argument invalid? Botros explains:

Its first premise says no more than that moral judgments have an influence on action, yet its second premise states as much of reason. Admittedly, reason, even on this reading, only influences action with the help of desire, but for all premise 1 says … moral judgments might also require this help. (27)

Botros rightly emphasizes the fact that Premise 1 does not say that moral judgments influence action all on their own.

The second problem with the moderate reading is that it requires ignoring, overlooking, or disregarding those of Hume's statements that tell against the 'moderate' interpretation. Hume, in fact, states the second premise of the practicality argument in two contradictory ways. In some passages in 3.1.1 Hume states that reason alone cannot motivate action, the implication being that it can with the aid of something else. In other passages in 3.1.1 he states that reason has no effect whatsoever on motivation or action. This, according to Botros, is what Hume intends when he writes in 3.1.1 that reason "has no influence [on our passions and actions]," it "can never immediately prevent or produce any action," it is "perfectly inert," and it is "wholly inactive." Botros' reasonable suggestion is that these statements be taken on their face. Her proposal for dealing with the ambiguities in the text is:

[T]o treat the practicality argument as if there were, compressed within its apparently unitary structure, two arguments -- one valid, one invalid -- depending upon whether premise 2 is taken to mean that reason moves us to action, but only with the help of desire, or that reason cannot move us to action [at all]. (60)

To distinguish the second interpretation from the moderate one, she calls it the 'extreme' version since it denies any role to reason in the production of action. Moreover, she maintains that the 'extreme' reading of the argument is valid and is entirely distinct from the 'moderate' one.

However, Botros explains that for the extreme reading of the argument to be taken seriously, its target needs to be specified. Indeed, an immediate objection to understanding the argument in the 'extreme' way is that it contradicts Hume's insistence in 3.1.1 and other parts of the Treatise that reason can influence action. The key to sorting out this puzzle, according to Botros, is to provide a context for understanding Hume's claim that reason is 'perfectly inert' which does not contradict his other statements regarding its activity. This is Botros' project in Chapter Three. Here, she argues that the 'extreme' version of the argument should be understood as directed at the moral rationalists, specifically Samuel Clarke and Ralph Cudworth.

What is Clarke’s and Cudworth's account of reason, the foundation of moral obligation, and explanation of moral motivation? According to these rationalists, our moral obligations are ultimately derived from the bare reason of the world -- the reason inherent in things and their relations as they exist outside of us. Clarke, for instance, claims that there is an eternal, objective, immutable nature of things, making some actions fit to be done, i.e. morally obligatory, and others not, which holds prior to and independently of our recognition of it. Moreover, Clarke simply affirms that the wills of moral agents are accessible to reason. He claims that the external, eternal, objective relations of fitness can, once laid bare to our understanding, directly impinge on our wills and so lead to action. For the rationalists, then, the immediate and sole precursor to moral action -- that which provides a complete explanation of the action -- is not two subjective psychological states: one cognitive and another conative. Rather, Botros explains that what provides the explanation is "the objective relation itself -- that 'fitness' of an action to its circumstances whose existence guarantees the truth of the corresponding moral judgment -- and a subjective state of the agent, namely, a determination of the agent's will" (92-93). This, at any rate, is, according to Botros, how Hume understands the rationalist's position.

Why does Clarke's and Cudworth's account of reason mark them as suitable targets for the 'extreme' reading of the practicality argument and, more specifically, Hume's charge that reason is wholly powerless? First, Botros explains that to call something inert is to say that it cannot itself be moved, changed, or affected. Moreover, at the time when Hume wrote the Treatise, it was assumed that the ability of something to bring about a change in another and its own ability to undergo change were linked. More specifically, it was thought that if something cannot undergo change, it also cannot on its own produce a change in anything else. Hence, during this time, when someone called something inert, she could have been either pointing to it inability to be itself affected or its inability to affect something else (70-71).

Botros maintains that given this background regarding the meaning of "inertness" and the rationalist's conception of what reason is, we can make sense of Hume's claim that reason is wholly powerless. According to the rationalists, reason is an objective, external, and unchangeable feature of the world. Hence, it itself cannot bring about a change in anything, let alone the wills of human beings. This, according to Botros, is what Hume is trying to point out to the rationalists when he claims that reason is perfectly inert. So, when in 3.1.1 Hume asserts the categorical impotence of reason, he is not using 'reason' as he understands it, but in the way his targets do -- as something eternal, objective, external and unchangeable. On the 'extreme' reading the practicality argument should be understood as follows: Moral judgments are linked in the ordinary causal way with motivation. Reason, as the moral rationalists construe it, could not on pain of absurdity play any part in motivation. Hence, morality cannot be a matter of reason (95).

Botros' book is a careful, systematic analysis of 3.1.1. She convincingly establishes that anyone who thought these passages in Hume are straightforward or easy to interpret is misguided. Moreover, she offers significant textual evidence that anyone espousing the 'moderate' version of Hume's argument faces significant difficulties. Not only does she show that all standard interpretations thus far offered of 3.1.1 leave the argument invalid, but she also explains why making the argument valid is a particularly difficult task. In addition, she thoroughly considers the most plausible ways of rescuing the argument's validity and shows why they fail.

I, however, am unconvinced of one of Botros' main conclusions in Part I -- that the ambiguities in 3.1.1 are best resolved by understanding Hume as having different opponents in mind when he states that reason alone cannot motivate action and when he states that reason is perfectly inert. The first reason I am unconvinced stems from the text itself. As Botros herself recognizes, for her solution to be successful, we need to be able to identify which parts of 3.1.1 are directed against the rationalists and which are not. Botros' solution would be plausible if it were the case that every time Hume asserts the categorical impotence of reason, he clearly has the rationalist's sense of 'reason' in mind, and, conversely, if every time he asserts that reason alone cannot influence action, he clearly has some other target in mind. This is not what we find in the text, however.

There is at least one place in 3.1.1 where Hume asserts the perfect inertness of reason and is clearly using 'reason' in his own sense, not that of the rationalists. In paragraph 8 of 3.1.1, Hume explains that he argued for the crucial second premise of the practicality argument in a previous section, namely 2.3.3. Moreover, what he claims is the conclusion of 2.3.3 is telling. He states that in 2.3.3 he "prov'd, that reason is perfectly inert, and can never either prevent or produce any action or affection." Now if Botros' solution is to be convincing, it must be that in 2.3.3, Hume means by 'reason' what the rationalists meant by it. This, however, is not the case. In this section Hume is considering what role reason on his own conception of it could have in the production of action. In the second paragraph of 2.3.3 Hume states, "The understanding [i.e. reason] exerts itself after two different ways, as it judges from demonstration or probability." Hume is repeating a claim he established in Book 1 Part 3 of the Treatise. And, as is characteristic of Hume, after reminding the reader of the two "species of reasoning," he argues that neither alone can be a motive to action.

Conversely, in paragraph 5 of 3.1.1 Hume states his second premise in the more moderate way -- that reason alone cannot motivate -- and it is apparent that his target is the moral rationalists. After summarizing Clarke's account of reason and moral obligation, Hume states:

In order, therefore, to judge of these systems [i.e. Clarke's], we need only consider, whether it be possible, from reason alone, to distinguish betwixt moral good and evil, or whether there must concur some other principles to enable us to make that distinction.

As this quote indicates, Hume clearly thinks that to undermine Clarke's view, he needs to establish only the more moderate claim -- that reason alone is not enough to make moral distinctions -- and not the more extreme one -- that reason is perfectly inert.

My second reason for finding Botros' solution implausible is related to the last statement quoted by Hume. Botros maintains, I think wrongly, that a moderate reading of the practicality argument could not be directed at the moral rationalists. She states that her understanding of Hume's claim that reason is wholly powerless seals off the 'extreme' reading of premise 2 from the 'moderate' reading. She claims:

It would seem a hopeless enterprise for anyone, rejecting the claim that 'the eternal reason of the world' could … impinge on the will, to try to salvage for this same conception of reason any motivating role at all, even a minor one alongside desire … Consequently, the objection (familiar from the 'moderate' reading of the practicality argument) that reason cannot on its own bring about action, but needs desire, must, if it is to have any relevance at all, be directed at a wholly different position from the moral rationalists'. (71)

I am not convinced, however. It is true that on the rationalist's conception of reason, reason is perfectly inert. It does not follow from this fact, however, that "this same conception of reason" can have no role to play in the explanation of someone's actions. Let me explain. Suppose a subject moves from a motivational state in which she does not desire to P to another motivational state in which she does desire to P. Could an explanation of this change in motivation consist entirely or solely in the existence of eternal relations of fitness or unfitness? No, not if these relations are fixed and unchangeable. If everything else remains the same, since these relations are themselves fixed, they alone could not provide an explanation of the change in motivation. Does this entail, however, that these relations could play absolutely no role in such an explanation? Botros seems to think that the correct answer to this question is yes, but I think this is too hasty a conclusion. Suppose someone is not motivated to P. Suppose further that something about her changes -- which cannot be explained by the relations of fitnesses alone -- and she becomes motivated to, say, listen to the dictates of reason. And, given what the dictates of reason are, she then becomes motivated to P. Further suppose that if the dictates of reason had been different than they are, she would not have subsequently become motivated to P. She would have become motivated to do something else. In such a situation, that the eternal relations are what they are will factor into an explanation of a change in her motivations. Although reason alone could not have produced or explain such a change, it could be part of the complete explanation of this change. That is, if something else besides reason changes, then the immutable relations of fitnesses could affect what an agent is or is not motivated to do.

The previous objection not withstanding, this is an extremely important book. Botros brings to light an ambiguity in Hume's text that is crucially important, with which anyone attempting to interpret or use Hume's arguments will need to contend. She impressively and convincingly argues that there is a glaring blind spot among Humean scholars and meta-ethicists with respect to the parts of Hume's text that contradict the standard or 'moderate' reading of the argument.