Hume's Morality: Feeling and Fabrication

Placeholder book cover

Rachel Cohon, Hume's Morality: Feeling and Fabrication, Oxford University Press, 2008, 285pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199268443.

Reviewed by Christine Swanton, University of Auckland



Rachel Cohon provides an excellent, detailed, scholarly and thorough analysis of Hume’s moral theory. Cohen’s analysis is basically correct, especially by comparison with the dominant “received view”. Although her book officially has two parts, I think of it as, in a sense, having three. The first “part” consists of analyzing and rejecting what Cohon calls “the common reading” of Hume, a reading that she rightly claims is very dominant. As she points out, this reading has strongly shaped the way in which Hume is understood by those in the analytic tradition, and those trained in that tradition find it hard to break free of it. She can hardly be blamed therefore for dealing with this reading before getting to her own views even though this reader, who has never been tempted by the common reading (probably because she was never taught Hume), felt an irresistible urge to move straight to the heart of Cohon’s positive interpretation. Cohon successfully refutes three aspects, or three theses, of the common reading: “The Motivational Inertia of Belief”, ethical non-cognitivism, and the logical fact/value gap, which depends on a misinterpretation of the is/ought passage.

Although she successfully rebuts the common reading, Cohon admits that she finds it hard “to break free of its hold” (13). This is evidenced in what I regard as her underestimation of the resources at Hume’s disposal for criticizing society’s views of virtue. I discuss this problem below.

Part 1, “Feeling Virtue”, outlines Cohon’s understanding of Hume’s meta-ethics as a reaction-dependent theory. She attributes to Hume a “moral sensing” view that she initially proposes as an epistemological view: “Treatise Book 3 part 1 is best read as an epistemology of value” (101). Later, however, in her rejection of the projectivist interpretation, she claims that “the relational property that constitutes virtue and vice comes into being in the interaction between the observed character (a natural object) and the sensitive mind” (122). I would have thought that this latter (ontological) reading is in fact the correct interpretation of Hume’s view of moral properties. That is, moral properties themselves are response dependent; it is not just the case that we become aware of them through a moral sense.

In an interesting discussion Cohon addresses the issue of what kind of properties virtue and vice are. Cohon claims that in attributing virtue, we are attributing a property, “whatever it may be”, of which we are aware by sensation or feeling. This is to make the property rather too mysterious on my view and presses too far the colour analogy. If a property is attributed under the description “virtue” what is attributed is a good trait of character, and thus a property that has features which make that trait good. All this is quite consistent with the fact that without emotions such as benevolence, which Hume regards as requisite for a moral sense, we could not sense virtue, and virtue as a normative property would not exist.

Along the way, Cohon does an excellent job of dismantling non-cognitivist readings by sensitive interpretation of texts, which she relates to Hume’s predecessors as appropriate. Examples include her interpretation of Hume’s denial that merit and demerit are identical with truth and falsehood (109), her understanding of the is/ought passage and its context, and her argument that moral impressions can be copied into truth-apt ideas (106).

Part 2, “The Fabrication of Virtue”, discusses the artificial virtues of justice and honesty, fidelity to promises and contract, allegiance or law abidingness, chastity and modesty (as a gendered virtue), and good manners. Here Cohon takes seriously the independence of the “immediately agreeable” criterion of virtue in her attack on reading Hume as a proto utilitarian, claiming that it can even trump considerations of social utility (257). This is one reason why the “social utility standard” for the distinction between virtue and vice cannot be ascribed to Hume. In this I believe Cohon is correct. However she adduces another reason, which I think is more dubious, for denying that social utility is the standard of virtue, namely that it “seriously undercuts Hume’s sentimentalism” (258).

Hume’s sentimentalism is a meta-ethical position about the response-dependent nature of moral properties, a position which affects Hume’s definition of virtue. The criteria of virtue (those properties which make traits virtues, or their resultance bases) are quite another matter. It is true in a way that pleasure (specifically the pleasures that give rise to moral approbation) is the essence of moral virtue in an ontological sense, for as Cohon rightly claims it is one of the relata of the relational property of virtue. (The other is the power to arouse the moral sense.) However traits are not virtues because they are approved, even from the common point of view, but because of their resultance base — those varied features about traits themselves, such as their utility, which make them virtues.

A consequence of running together the meta-ethical sentimentalist analysis of the nature of virtue as a property with the substantive criteria of virtue is that Cohon underestimates the justificatory resources available to Hume, especially in regard to the features which tend to make virtues agreeable to “immediate taste or sentiment”. Consider first the criterion of virtue: consequences for the good of mankind. It is puzzling that Cohon thinks that Hume is apparently committed to the view, at least in the Treatise, that “traits falsely thought to bring benefit, and consequently approved from the common point of view, are indeed virtues” (246). Would not Hume want to say that people can be wrong about virtue in this particular kind of case even if not blameworthy, since they are wrong about traits’ tendencies? The necessary cooperation of the understanding requisite for determining virtue has not yielded truth as “agreement” about consequences. Certainly the common point of view is a corrective for an important kind of epistemic or imaginative vice the avoidance of which is crucial in the assessment of virtue and vice (biases of distance and partiality), a kind of vice discussed in Book 3 of the Treatise. (Others are discussed in Book 1). Moral assessment should be made from that point of view if it is not to be biased, but it is not a determinative criterion of virtue.

We are now in a position to see the powerful resources Hume has at his disposal for criticizing our sentiments of immediate disagreeability. Cohon uses the example of the immediate disagreeability of homosexuality in people of Hume’s day to cast doubt on the assumption that Hume can adequately criticize prevalent opinion. She argues, correctly in my opinion, that homosexuality on Hume’s view can be regarded as a character trait being a sexual orientation, or proclivity, but claims that “we must grant that for Hume, as long as most people find homosexuality immediately disagreeable, and this is transmitted to the observer via sympathy, it is indeed a vice” (251-2, 265). In this case, the “common point of view” has apparently been attained and consequently Hume would have “to include homosexuality on his list of vices simply because his contemporaries found it immediately disagreeable” (264, 251). However if the imagination has become disordered as a result of doxastic vice, a condition that Hume discusses at some length in Book 1, the moral sentiment can be adversely affected and needs to be corrected. If, in particular, the immediate disagreeabilty of homosexuality is due to prejudice, religious superstition resulting in excessive credulity, “carelessness” in assessing scientific findings and so on, the moral sense in this case is not authoritative.

Cohon’s discussion of the artificial virtues themselves is a sensitive and welcome treatment of their status in Hume. Again Cohon argues very effectively against received views, but at times still concedes too much to “common readings” such as Gauthier’s. Although Hume states explicitly that some acts of justice and promise-keeping need not serve an agent’s (net) interests, she claims, e.g., that Treatise 497 is “equivocal” and can be read as both supporting and denying this view (211). I do not see this. At 497 Hume makes three claims concerning this issue:

(a) Single acts of justice may be “contrary, either to public or private interest”.

(b) The scheme of justice is requisite to the well being of every individual.

© It is true of every individual that it is in her net interest to be a member of a society in which there is a scheme of justice rather than a member of a society in which there is no such scheme, for without such a scheme “everyone [even the strongest] must fall into that savage and solitary condition, which is infinitely worse than then worst situation that can possibly be suppos’d in society”.

It is good that Cohon treats Hume as making contributions to virtue ethics; indeed she regards Hume’s work as providing two lessons for that form of moral theory. On my view however it is questionable that these lessons are to be learned by virtue ethicists as opposed to stereotypical versions. Virtue ethicists do not denigrate motives appropriate to justice — duty, honour and so forth. Stocker’s worry was the application of the motive of duty to areas where it does not (at least characteristically) belong, namely in contexts of the affectional virtues. Virtue ethicists also denigrate the denigration of those virtues, challenging the claim that they are not really relevant to morality, and Hume is a wonderful ally in this cause.

As to the second lesson, where the “primacy of character” thesis comes into question, things are even murkier, since it is unclear to me in what way that thesis characterizes virtue ethics. The Hursthouse formula for rightness defines rightness in terms of the choices of a virtuous agent, but what a virtuous agent would choose is determined by the nature of the fields of the various virtues (for that is what determines a virtuous agent’s reasons). (This I think creates a problem for the Hursthouse criterion of right action, and that is why I reject it, from a virtue ethical perspective, but that is another matter.) Now the field of the virtue of justice is, on Hume’s view, the conventions and rules of property, so a virtuous agent’s choices are determined by the nature of those rules (i.e., she respects them). Perhaps the primacy of character thesis is intended to imply that right actions are by definition well-motivated actions. This is not Hursthouse’s view and arguably not even Hume’s, who tends to attach praiseworthiness and blameworthiness to (stable) motivation.

Even though I think that at times Cohon does not go quite far enough in rejecting the “common reading”, she does a marvellous job of rebutting it and is basically on the right track in her positive interpretation of Hume as a “moral sensing” theorist. Her book is a “must read” for anyone working in Hume’s ethics and moral theory generally.