Hume's Radical Scepticism and the Fate of Naturalized Epistemology

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Kevin Meeker, Hume's Radical Scepticism and the Fate of Naturalized Epistemology, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 196pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137025548.

Reviewed by Angela Coventry, Portland State University


There may be general agreement that David Hume is some sort of sceptic,[1] but the nature and extent of his scepticism remains a topic of considerable debate amongst scholars. Some scholars claim his scepticism undermines the pursuit of a more positive naturalistic program of a science of human nature, while others maintain that his scepticism is reconcilable with his naturalism. In his book, Kevin Meeker maintains that Hume is a "radical sceptic" of the sort who maintains that all human beliefs are "equal, epistemically speaking" in that none of them have any "positive epistemic status" (17, 26). His interpretation is set against those scholars who emphasize his naturalism. If the main arguments in the book succeeds, then Meeker hopes to "shift the burden of proof" to those who prefer the naturalist reading (7).

The book consists of eight chapters. Chapter One, 'A Tale of Two Interpretations,' details the sceptical versus naturalist readings of Hume. Meeker attributes to Hume 'epistemic egalitarianism' (EE) or the slightly more cumbersome 'parity E-scepticism,' that all beliefs "lack the positive epistemic status of being more justified/rational/warranted than their contraries" or simply that "no belief has any epistemic merit" (17, 43). 'E-scepticism' or 'epistemic or evaluative scepticism' is the position that all beliefs lack "positive epistemic status" (16). A type of certainty E-scepticism might hold, for example, that no belief is certain. 'E-scepticism' contrasts with 'D-scepticism' or 'doxastic scepticism.' D-scepticism comes with the normative recommendation that all beliefs should be abandoned (17). Meeker denies that Hume is a D-sceptic but thinks that Hume is best read as holding to E-scepticism, which encompasses parity E-scepticism and certainty E-scepticism (17, 21). To defend his reading, Meeker proposes the Primary Interpretive Principle (PIP) to approach the texts, that "if a text appears to assert X, then one is prima facie justified in interpreting the text as asserting X" (5). So if Hume appears to say radically sceptical things, then we are at least "prima facie justified in interpreting Hume's texts as asserting radical scepticism" (6, 154).

Chapters Two and Three concern the arguments presented by Hume in the first section of Book 1, Part 4 of the Treatise, 'Of scepticism with regard to reason.' Chapter Two, 'Fallibility Gains a Foothold: A Model for Understanding Humean Scepticism,' examines Hume's argument for the claim that "all knowledge degenerates into probability" (T; SBN 180). Here Meeker shows that he is committed to certainty E-scepticism: the thesis that "none of our beliefs are certain" in the context of his views on demonstrative knowledge (19, 22, 26, 42). The discussion in the third chapter, 'Fallibility's Ultimate Epistemic Consequence,' examines what Meeker calls the "iterative probability argument" (43). The argument purports to show that probable reasoning, when allowed to pursue its own principles without restraint, inevitably leads to a destruction or "total extinction" of all beliefs based upon that reasoning (T; SBN 183). Meeker concludes that since Hume's text appears to endorse EE or parity E-scepticism, by "(PIP) . . . we are prima facie justified in attributing epistemic egalitarianism to Hume's 'Of Scepticism with Regard to Reason'" (64).

The next two chapters explore some of the other relevant passages in Hume's works in support of the radical sceptical interpretation. In Chapter Four, 'Belief without Evidence,' Meeker connects EE to Hume's treatment of belief and the famous conclusion to Book One, Part Four to the Treatise wherein Hume describes himself as a person who "having narrowly escaped shipwreck . . . has yet the temerity to put out to sea in the same leaky weather-beaten vessel" (T; SBN 263). The fifth chapter, 'Endorsing Epistemic Egalitarianism,' discusses the presence of the radical scepticism in Hume's later works including the Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding and the Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Meeker deems it plausible that "Hume always endorsed epistemic egalitarianism in all of his philosophical writings that explicitly discuss scepticism" (101).

Chapters Six and Seven focus on whether Hume has the right stuff "to construct a naturalized epistemology that would save him from scepticism" (23). In Chapter Six, 'Scepticism and the "Nature" of Naturalized Epistemology,' Meeker draws lessons from Hempel's Dilemma for physicalism to explain that Hume's own pursuit of naturalism brings to light how all versions of naturalized epistemology lead to radical scepticism. Epistemic externalist readings are often seen as "intimately" or "inextricably intertwined with naturalized epistemology," so in the next chapter, 'Hume's Naturalistic Internalism,' Meeker examines and rejects recent epistemic externalist readings of Hume (23, 121). He claims that Hume's comments on reason, miracles and the causal inference all have "internalist elements," and that makes externalism "questionable at best" (23, 138).

The eighth and final chapter, 'Philosophy After Scepticism,' takes up the issue of whether radical "scepticism is too unreasonable a position to attribute to Hume" (140). Meeker first addresses how Hume can consistently be a radical sceptic and still practice philosophy by drawing parallels with the recent work of Peter Unger (143-46). Next, he argues that Hume's scepticism is "much more common" in contemporary philosophy than one might think, and situates Hume's position in recent work in the epistemology of disagreement and cognitive psychology to show how in line his view is to "cutting-edge work in these fields" (23, 140).

The remainder of my review considers whether Meeker fully succeeds in the radical sceptical reading of Hume. As noted, the focus of Meeker's book is the arguments contained in the section on scepticism with regard to reason at Treatise 1.4.1. He sees this section as "by far the most forceful and explicit statement of scepticism in Hume's corpus" (22). Meeker is certainly right about the importance of the section. However despite the amount of detail given to the arguments in that section in the book, the treatment of the arguments was a bit limited on two counts.

First, Hume clearly borrows the sceptical arguments about reason from somewhere as he writes of "displaying so carefully the arguments of that fantastic sect" (T; SBN 183). However there is no discussion in the book on the origin of the arguments in that section.[2] This lack of attention to the origin of the arguments that Hume refers to is perhaps understandable given Meeker's contemporary focus. Nonetheless some discussion of the historical context is needed to properly make sense of Hume's appropriation of the arguments.

Second, one may grant Meeker's painstaking interpretation of the arguments yet still question whether Hume actually endorses the arguments laid out in the section. A consideration of the section within the broader context of Book 1, Part 4 of the Treatise is relevant. Treatise 1.4 deals with a wide range of sceptical systems to do with the external world, notions of substance, substantial forms, accidents and occult qualities in ancient philosophy, primary and secondary qualities in modern philosophy, the immateriality of the soul and personal identity. At the end of the survey, Hume claims to have adopted a "miscellaneous way of reasoning" to examine these "several systems of philosophy, both of the intellectual and natural world" (T; SBN 263). The point of the survey is to either "illustrate or confirm some preceding part of this discourse or pave the way for the following discussion in the conclusion" (T; SBN 263). Hume writes that the point of putting forward the sceptical argument about reason is not to endorse it but rather to confirm the "truth" of his own hypotheses about custom and belief defended in Book 1, Part 3 of the Treatise (T; SBN 183). In fact, Hume seems to distance himself from the conclusion of the argument about reason:

Shou'd it here be ask'd me, whether I sincerely assent to this argument, which I seem to take such pains to inculcate, and whether I be really one of those sceptics, who hold that all is uncertain, and that our judgment is not in any thing possest of any measures of truth and falshood; I shou'd reply, that this question is entirely superfluous, and that neither I, nor any other person was ever sincerely and constantly of that opinion. . . . My intention then in displaying so carefully the arguments of that fantastic sect, is only to make the reader sensible of the truth of my hypothesis, that all our reasonings concerning causes and effects are derived from nothing but custom; and that belief is more properly an act of the sensitive, than of the cogitative part of our natures. (T; SBN 183)

Hume goes on to use his principles of the mind to explain why this sort of total skepticism is not an option for us.

A final point concerns the more positive remarks Hume makes about his scientific project. Hume signals a return to naturalism after the survey of scepticism. He indicates that it is now time to return to "the accurate anatomy of human nature" (T; SBN 263). A few hundred pages later in the conclusion of Book 3, Part 3 on morals, he is optimistic that "nothing is wanting to an accurate proof of this system of ethics" (T; SBN 618). The Treatise begins with the promise of a science of the mind that "will not be inferior in certainty, and will be much superior in utility to any other of human comprehension" (T Intro.10; SBN xix). Even Meeker allows that Hume has a "naturalistic project" and discusses the "general continuation of his philosophical reflections" (155). E-scepticism is deemed compatible with the belief that beliefs "might enjoy other types of positive epistemic status" by other means and that some beliefs are "more rational or justified" than others (16). Hume, he says, is "in some sense a naturalized epistemologist" even if "no version of it examined can save him from radical scepticism" (23). Meeker grants that "potential positive results can still be gleaned from Hume's naturalistic project despite its sceptical consequences" (140). Indeed the last few chapters of Meeker's book explicitly assume that Hume is carrying out some sort of naturalistic project. This underscores the importance of understanding the nature and extent of his naturalism. That is, we still need to figure out his positive remarks on the "accuracy" and "utility" of his science and its continuing relevance to understand the nature and extent of his scepticism.

A distinctive and welcome feature of Meeker's approach is that it connects Hume to many wide-ranging aspects in current epistemology. Meeker also engages extensively with the secondary literature and carefully contrasts his view with other commentators. Hume's Radical Scepticism and the Fate of Naturalized Epistemology will undoubtedly be a central source for future discussions by scholars on the relation between naturalism and scepticism in Hume's philosophy.[3]

[1] After all he does say in the Abstract to the Treatise of Human Nature that his philosophy is "very sceptical and tends to give us a notion of the imperfections and narrow limits of human understanding," T Ab.27; SBN 657. References to the Treatise are to Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. D. F. Norton and M. J. Norton, 2 vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007), hereafter cited "T" followed by Book, part, section, and paragraph, and to A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge, revised by P. H. Nidditch (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1978), hereafter cited in the text as "SBN" followed by page numbers. All other page references are to Meeker's work.

[2] Two scholars who take on this issue are Graciela De Pierris (2005), "Hume and Descartes on Skepticism with regard to Demonstrative Reasoning," Análisis Filosófico 25 (2): 101-119 and Fred Wilson (1985), "The Origins of Hume's Sceptical Argument against Reason," History of Philosophy Quarterly 2 (3): 323-335.

[3] Many thanks to P. J. E. Kail for useful discussion.