Husserl and the Promise of Time: Subjectivity in Transcendental Phenomenology

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Nicolas de Warren, Husserl and the Promise of Time: Subjectivity in Transcendental Phenomenology, Cambridge UP, 2009, 309pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521876797.

Reviewed by Kenneth Knies, Husserl Archives, Katholieke Universiteit Leuven



We are resending this review because the earlier version contained an editorial error that altered the reviewer’s meaning in the first paragraph. We apologize for the error.

The topic of de Warren’s study, inner-time consciousness, is hardly discussed in phenomenological circles without an invocation of its “notorious difficulty.” Indeed, Husserl never ceased returning to what he himself often called the most difficult of all phenomenological problems. The difficulties of time-consciousness, moreover, do not concern a particularly vexing topic within a defined field and method of philosophical research. As de Warren’s title indicates, the very promise of phenomenology as transcendental philosophy hinges upon its ability to describe the concrete experiencing in which all possible domains of transcendent being are displayed. This experiencing is itself temporal in its nature or “sense of being” (30). Coming to terms with the difficulties of time-consciousness is thus necessary if descriptions of phenomenologically defined themes are not to remain ignorant of the most basic structures inherent in experience itself. This task that Husserl has bequeathed to his followers is complicated by the fact that his on-going efforts to understand time not only trace a course of self-criticism but also attain a dizzying level of abstraction and diagrammatic modeling. The danger is that engaging the analytic difficulties of Husserl’s account will empty the time problem of its profundity. The question that was to lead phenomenological investigation into the most intimate core of subjectivity would instead occupy the mind with logical constructions and conceptual puzzles that fail to resonate with our unceasing sense of ourselves as living through time.

Phenomenologists, historians of modern philosophy, and philosophers of time should all benefit from de Warren’s confrontation with the difficulties of time-consciousness. De Warren’s study operates with an impressive density of insight at multiple levels. It explains the methodological importance of time-consciousness for Husserl’s philosophical program. It clearly presents the historical developments in the questioning of time most relevant to Husserl’s inheritance of the problem from Brentano. It identifies the special difficulties posed for phenomenology by the question of time, and traces one path along which Husserl made progress in resolving them. Finally, it indicates how Husserl’s mature understanding of time contributes to an account of inter-subjectivity and genesis within a transcendental framework. In all of this, de Warren confronts the complexity of Husserl’s descriptions without losing sight of the fact that they are meant to answer to and make comprehensible our rich awareness of being in time. This book is a bold traversal of territory scouted and surveyed by pioneers like Bernet, Brough, Held, Lohmar, Kortooms, Sokolowski and Zahavi. It is not simply an exercise in Husserl scholarship, but an original “take” on what Husserl was grappling with in thinking about time. Its lack of encyclopedic breadth in its treatment of Husserl is more than made up for in its direct articulation of a compelling, if contentious, philosophy of time.1

De Warren’s most forceful presentation of the methodological importance of time-consciousness for phenomenology is based on Iso Kern’s three-fold approach to the transcendental phenomenological reduction.2 Phenomenological investigation begins with the suspension of one’s belief in the existence of a transcendent world as the context in which experience of the world takes place. This suspension, for Husserl, has the capacity to reveal my own experiencing as the dimension in which everything worldly, including myself taken as a psycho-physical organism, acquires whatever meaning and validity it has. As such, experience is shown to be transcendental or world-constituting rather than empirical or mundane. Husserl’s basic epistemological conviction is that if it takes shape in a method appropriate to its subject matter, reflection on the eidetic structures of transcendental experience will progressively fulfill the highest goals of philosophy as a theory of knowledge and the universe of knowable being. Following Kern’s approach, the reduction to transcendental subjectivity can be formulated in both Cartesian and Kantian registers. Construed as the fulfillment of a Cartesian impulse, the reduction reveals subjectivity as an indubitable foundation for knowledge. The inerrant statement “I am thinking” refers to a dimension of immanence whose self-possession and certainty remains uncompromised by every conceivable state of affairs. The broadly Kantian formulation focuses on the accomplishments of subjectivity as the condition for world-constitution. Here, the reduction discloses “how experience is at all possible for consciousness in the form of its possible intelligibility” (28-9). In other words, it allows us to view regions of being through the meaning-bestowing acts of consciousness to which they are necessarily correlative.

De Warren’s basic claim here is that these two aspects of reduction, and everything that they promise regarding a transcendental theory of knowledge, depend upon a third dimension of the reduction, the accomplishment of which requires a novel insight into time. This third formulation is influenced by Brentano. It focuses on subjectivity as concrete, self-aware experiencing (29). The return to the cogito is not reducible to an axiom because it is rooted in my self-awareness in an act of cogitating. Likewise, the conditioning of all domains of reality in the accomplishments of transcendental subjectivity does not provide rules that “legislate experience”; instead “experience is the performance, or accomplishment of consciousness” (32). To understand how subjectivity is a foundation and source of world-constitution, Husserl must capture the concrete way in which consciousness is “for itself” in its accomplishments. As de Warren points out, the being of consciousness, for Husserl, “is implicitly recognized as temporal through and through” (40); “consciousness is given to itself, or lived as an experience, in an intrinsically temporal manner” (44). In keeping with this appeal to an “implicit recognition,” de Warren first advances his perspective without turning directly to the analysis of time-consciousness. Instead, he indicates the universal importance of temporality through a discussion of the synthetic and intentional character of consciousness (largely in terms of Ideas I and Cartesian Meditations). A transcendent being is displayed in an unfolding synthesis of actual and possible experiences in which an object’s sense is continually enriched. The intentional and immanent synthesizing of consciousness allows us to catch sight of why time will provide the key to understanding the being of consciousness (30), as well as the “origin of the difference between … mind and world” (47). De Warren’s approach to time through the reduction to concrete lived experience also suggests, from the beginning, that our perplexity about time is linked with our perplexity about who we are (3).

Throughout, de Warren’s presentation of basic phenomenological concepts is rich in intuition and makes use of examples in a way that is fruitful, often creative, and never indulgent. The Husserl specialist will not feel subjected to a rehearsal of accepted doctrine, nor will those somewhat unfamiliar with phenomenology feel overwhelmed by a technical, empty jargon. That said, philosophers from perspectives outside the orbit of transcendental idealism will likely find that the book too easily assents to unlikely theses about the absolute nature of consciousness. De Warren does not introduce or advocate transcendental phenomenology via the problem of time, but rather addresses time as the fundamental problem of transcendental phenomenology. Having outlined the methods and themes most relevant to phenomenology’s epistemological aspirations, de Warren will show how Husserl’s discovery of a “transcendental absolute” in the immanent being of consciousness remains a presentiment that only attains concrete confirmation in continual explorations of time (48).

De Warren prepares us to think along with Husserl by reviewing the historical considerations that shaped Brentano’s orientation toward the problem of time. Husserl’s 1904/1905 lectures “On Inner Time-Consciousness” (hereafter ITC) proceed through a direct engagement with Brentano’s theory of proteraesthesis (perception of the earlier-than). It is thus important to understand the historical provenance of Brentano’s theory and what he hoped to accomplish with it. De Warren’s reflections here are meant to clarify what is original in Husserl’s contribution vis-à-vis the tradition and to identify the motivations that led Brentano to approach the vast question of time through this particular entryway. The treatments of Aristotle, Locke and Brentano himself should be read with these aims in mind. They are not full-blown explorations of what these philosophers had to say about time.

Condensing de Warren’s presentations, we conclude that the most significant outcomes of Brentano’s critical understanding of Aristotle and Locke are the following: a) any psychology that presupposes a lapse of time as the basis for a distinction between perception of the present and recollection of the past is inadequate because the original constitution of specific temporal modes — lapse or succession itself — must be accounted for; likewise, the telling of time according to physical motions presupposes an experience of now, before and after that has to be explained as a conscious accomplishment; b) in the account of the experience of succession, it is not sufficient to appeal to a present retention of what was before conscious. One must describe the modification through which the past content is apprehended as not still present; additionally, c) one faces the problem that in reflection we clearly discover our experiencing itself as a temporal event. Because accounting for the consciousness of succession via the succession of consciousness would lead to an infinite regress, it seems that the pre-reflective awareness of succession depends upon the relation of the earlier and the later in a single act of consciousness. On the basis of this critical historical understanding, Brentano tries to discover the origin of the concept of time in a form of sensibility in which the earlier-than is given along with the present (proteros + aisthesis).

Within the framework of intentional psychology and its phenomenological transformation, de Warren presents an analysis of the differences between Brentano’s and Husserl’s theories of proteraisthesis or “primary memory.” More important to de Warren’s own account, however, is that we recognize a perspective from which Brentano’s theory and Husserl’s critique share a common shortcoming. It is in working through this initial shortcoming that Husserl will develop what de Warren considers to be his mature position. This position, in turn, will motivate de Warren to considerations and emphases of his own.

The key here is how de Warren situates both Brentano and the Husserl of the ITC lectures in relation to William Stern’s 1897 essay “Mental Presence-Time,” which presents a critique of the “dogma of momentary consciousness” (91-6). On the one hand, Husserl explicitly makes use of Stern in critiquing Brentano. On the other, Husserl will only accept Stern’s critique into the heart of his own analysis after “unwittingly” succumbing to the dogma himself (135). Put simply, the dogma of momentary consciousness is the assumption that the act of consciousness that displays succession must contain its contents simultaneously.

Brentano’s theory of primary memory roots our sense of the just-past in a modification of what is authentically given in sensible presence. The modified content, e.g. the bang I have just heard, is produced by the imagination as a non-intuitive phantasm (as opposed to the intuitive reproductions of memory) through original association with the present perception along with which it is given. This modification is automatic, irrepressible, and affects the present sensation in all its qualities. Crucially, what is now perceived and the modified just-past necessarily “form a single unity of consciousness” (86). Brentano’s account of primary memory participates in the doctrine of momentary consciousness because the form of this unity is momentary simultaneity. As de Warren puts it, Brentano’s is a theory of the “representation of succession in simultaneity” (91). For Brentano, “there is no perception of the present without an incidental grasp of the immediate past … but likewise … there is no perception of the immediate past, but only a perception of the momentary present” (86). In the immediacy of the perceptual now, I am aware of the just-past as a phantasm. Further, there is no original association attached to self-consciousness (86). Pre-reflective consciousness in no way experiences itself as a just-past phantasm: “the primary and secondary objects of time-consciousness — the now and the just-now — are encased within the simultaneity of one act of consciousness” (90).

Husserl’s reaction to Brentano is presented by de Warren as an effort to attain what the neologism proteraesthesis implies. This entails recognizing that the just-past appears in perception and enjoys an “intuitive continuity with the actual now” (88). The just-past is not an imaginary reproduction that dwells like a shadow in the immediacy of the perceived present, but a modalization within the perception itself (132). Leading the reader through one of Husserl’s famous diagrams of “running-off modes,” de Warren introduces the three-fold intentionality (retention, primal impression, protention) by which perceptual acts constitute an unfolding time-object (as just-now, actually now, and almost-now). De Warren’s analysis of this phenomenological staple is crisp and instructive. His focus is on how the co-operation of the three-fold apprehension accounts for the perception of an “in betweenness” without which musical structure, for instance, would be impossible (129). The now itself has a “transitional character,” and is given "as it is running-off" (118). At any given now point, which de Warren emphasizes is a useful abstraction (122-3), just-past notes are retained (heard) as earlier in relation to the actual note. This relation of earlier and later in the unity of what is now and just-past is itself given as running off into a past of continually further displaced pasts, each with its own temporal relata:

In every now-phase within the consciousness of a time-object we have a … consciousness of the succession of now-phases belonging to the time object … as well as a consciousness of the running-off continuity of each now phase, in relation to the actual now-phase of consciousness, but also in relative relation to each elapsing now-phase within the immediate past as a whole (125).

De Warren anticipates that this double continuity will be referred not only to the time-objects displayed in perceptual acts but also, "in some sense yet to be determined" (116), to perceptual acts themselves. It seems evident that my reading of a sentence not only constitutes a phased build-up of words that itself continually contracts and sinks away into the no-longer, but that the reading itself is experienced as somehow enduring and passing. By recognizing what Stern calls the “temporal distension” of acts as they disclose the “temporal extension” of objects, Husserl challenges the dogma of momentary consciousness. Yet, according to de Warren, even in his effort to avoid the infinite regress that this challenge precipitates, Husserl will at first reintroduce the dogma at the level of absolute consciousness.

In this connection, de Warren undertakes a critique of Husserl’s early apprehension-content-object theory of intentionality. We can here only bluntly indicate the concerns driving it. The dogma of simultaneity continues to undercut the genuine transcendence of the past if the constitution of temporal modes occurs through the apprehension of contents that are themselves temporally neutral, or, by default, present (135). If acts and sensa as well as objects enjoy some form of pre-reflective temporal dispersal as unfolding unities, there must be a consciousness that displays this dispersal, and the problem reemerges on a second level. Is the displaying simultaneous with what it displays? De Warren will also object to any account that avoids treating time-constituting consciousness as itself a temporal process at the cost of construing it as a non-dynamic, self-transparent, tripartite faculty of the soul (107). For de Warren, there is no static openness to time in which temporally determined unities would be constituted, but which itself would not flow — whatever “flowing” may turn out to mean here. In a pointed formulation, he writes that “the very self-givenness of consciousness is temporal and temporary” (168). It seems that if it is genuinely temporal, a consciousness of the now/just-past cannot be entirely present to itself and its immanent content. De Warren suggests that Husserl too would remain captive to dogma if pre-reflective acts are to be arrayed as quasi-objects before the disengaged spectatorship of a time-constituting consciousness that is without internal differentiation and senses itself non-ecstatically in a standing now.3

The turning point in the text consists in de Warren’s effort to account for the non-simultaneity of time-consciousness through analogy with forms of experience in which consciousness is given for itself as non-present in the now. De Warren here looks to Husserl’s analyses of image-consciousness, imagination and memory.4 The crucial insight is that in an act of imaginative seeing of X, for instance, the seeing of the imagined object as irreal is itself given as incompatible, discontinuous and non-simultaneous with my accompanying consciousness of actually imagining seeing X. De Warren speaks of a “double-consciousness” that is “contemporaneous without being simultaneous with itself” (158). I who “see” the imagined X and I who imagine I am seeing are one and the same, but are given through “the unity of consciousness as a distance within itself” (158). The quasi-seeing that is contemporaneous with my (absolute) consciousness of imagining, “is itself not present, or now, in immanent consciousness” (165). The reader will have to judge whether the careful analyses in these sections make comprehensible the paradoxical description “contemporaneous but not simultaneous.”

De Warren next traces a current in Husserl’s post-ITC development that admits an analogous form of non-coincidence into the core of inner time-consciousness and thus challenges “the previously unsuspected assumption that a consciousness of the past is itself present for itself” (170). His focus remains the problem of retention. De Warren will argue that the way consciousness retends itself (lengthwise intentionality) in intending its object (transverse intentionality) justifies the characterization of absolute consciousness as temporal life without reducing the consciousness of succession to the succession of consciousness. In sum, his thesis is that prior to any reflection, recollection, or indeed any discrete act of consciousness, self-awareness is a kind of ur-event involving a retention of myself as absent. De Warren’s discussions of self-retention consistently play up the emptying, absenting function of retention as opposed to its “holding on” to the just-past in the present: “rather than constitute givenness in terms of presence, retention constitutes an original givenness of absence” (247). In this sense, retention is an original constitution of the past as a not-now without basis in any actually present content. The retended perceptual consciousness, for de Warren, is “de-presentified” and yet together with the originating consciousness. In a smart expression, he writes that “retentional modification and original impression are given pairwise ‘at the same time’ but not as the same time” (183). The double intentionality of retention thus constitutes the temporality of perceptual consciousness itself, although “in a different manner” than the temporal object it brings into view. For de Warren, inner time-consciousness constitutes itself as this double differentiation: from its object displayed in the retentional field, and of itself as absented in retention (176, 290). Husserl’s metaphor of an absolute “flow” is justified because flow is equivalent to self-transcendence and differentiation: “the term ‘flow’ means, therefore, not duration — something enduring or given over or in time — but the form of always becoming other than myself” (205). In the end, de Warren will have Husserl identify the “self-appearance” of consciousness along its lengthwise intentionality with its self de-presentification (256).

Retention is always described as “working counter” to an original impression, “the well-spring of the visibility and affective force of lived-experience” (171). De Warren rightfully insists that it would be nonsensical to speak of the retention as “negating” the impression from the outside. The impression itself rather “irrupts in an interplay of retentional consciousness”; and decisively “the now is no longer than the retention of what no longer is” (171). If the retentional field is a comet’s tail, there is no experience of the head as ahead. The abstract distinction between impression and retention, (actually inseparable moments in the logical sense), creates the dynamic image of a tension between a fullness of presence that is “inhibited from within” or “reversed in mid-stream” by a de-presencing inevitably occurring together with it (183). In his reading of the Bernau Manuscripts, de Warren will trace how “this tension between the poles of retentional modification and original presentation” is “displaced onto the poles of retention and protention” (199). Husserl now explicitly conceives the original impression as a fulfillment of protentional consciousness. Once impression is conceived as fulfillment, de Warren emphasizes the “absolute novelty” by virtue of which the arriving now “always surpasses our expectation.” There is an “alterity of the new” that “interrupts from within … in such a manner that consciousness cannot recuperate itself entirely despite its own accomplishment in the folding and unfolding of temporality” (218). Indeed, de Warren’s downplaying of fulfillment leads him to characterize absolute consciousness as my being retentionally too late for myself (already having escaped myself), surpassed by myself in the novelty of the now (surprising myself as origin), and protentionally too early for myself (expecting myself as what I am not) (255-8). This thoroughgoing self-transcending in time is "the movement of life itself, not the failure of consciousness to coincide with itself but rather the success of missing itself in such a way that consciousness remains open to itself and the world" (259).

Let us here introduce two critical considerations. First, briefly, de Warren’s strong emphasis on the emptying, withholding and forgetting functions of retention would seem to cause difficulties in understanding its constitutive role in the disclosure of transcendent time-objects. The clarity and vivacity of an unfolding melody or sentence seems to take shape in the thickness of the retentional field itself. Perhaps this distinction is recognized in de Warren’s constant warning that retention does not retend its time-object “in the same manner” as it does immanent consciousness of that object. Second, and more generally, the reader may wonder whether de Warren gives a satisfactory account of why the original consciousness of inner-time should not entail an experience of ceaseless self-fulfillment or self-becoming as fundamentally as one of self-alteration and missing. As we saw above, de Warren interprets the self-accomplishment of consciousness in the folding and unfolding of time as the subordinate clause, the “despite” of time-consciousness. Why? And what is this folding and unfolding that would suggest self-possession? The key to posing this problem within Husserl’s framework might lie in drawing out the consequences of protention’s involvement in the self-constitution of the “flow” of absolute consciousness. As de Warren himself notes, in addition to foreshadowing the content of the almost-now on the basis of retentions, protention also protends the running-off modes as yet further sunken away as well as the abiding openness of the protentional horizon as such (197, 199). The necessity of retentional modification in consciousness is not a blind law, but itself given in the form of anticipated fulfillment. If it is legitimate to base existential conclusions about “myself” upon time as the most fundamental medium of my life, shouldn’t this movement of “general fulfillment”5 motivate conclusions that would balance those de Warren gleans from the self-missing of time-consciousness?

In the final third of his text, de Warren cashes in his emphasis on the de-presentation at the heart of pre-reflective self-awareness in a number of ways. In a remarkably economic critique, he argues that the Derridian deconstruction of transcendental subjectivity in Husserl depends upon a basic misunderstanding of time-consciousness. Most crucially, Derrida construes retention as a restitution of presence (and in this sense similar to recollection) whereas we learn from de Warren that it is primarily a de-presentification that accompanies and reverses original presentation in “mid-stream.” De Warren’s argument against entertaining an external “threat” to the immanence of consciousness is essentially that it is already “broken from within” (268). Perhaps of more general interest will be the account of the transcendence of Others that de Warren’s treatment of time makes possible. The link between the problems of time and the Other is that they both engage the basic epistemic goals of phenomenology in regard to the problem of what is irreducible to self-presence. As with time, so with the Other: “the challenge is to understand the givenness of absence without undermining the phenomenological adherence to the original givenness of presence, or evidence, as the foundation for all constitution” (215). In an incisive reading of the fifth of the Cartesian Meditations, de Warren shows how the presence of alterity of the other is required by phenomenology’s endeavor to account for the being of an objective world. The highlight here is his provocative suggestion that appresentation of the Other is best understood as exhibiting a “headless temporality” where retentions lack a “stabilizing center in the arc of my living presence” (248). Because such retentions were never originally present for me, they cannot bear a telos to fulfillment in recollection. Hence, “no demand is made on the Other to be given as itself and this restraint is a novel form of transcendence and constitution” (249). The book concludes by indicating how the study of time-consciousness, which clarifies the event of phenomenality at a level where “nothing yet happens,” prepares the analysis of subjectivity in its concrete becoming as an egological monad (275). Topics here include the constitution of possibility and actuality, potentiality, and associative synthesis.

De Warren’s text is a densely woven fabric that incorporates a broad range of phenomenological themes. Where it is not systematic, it is suggestive, and will serve as an invitation to further reflection.

1 De Warren does not directly interpret the material on time collected in the C-manuscripts, nor does he trace each shift in Husserl’s developing positions over the years. The interested reader might consult Klaus Held, Lebendige Gegendwart (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966). For a more recent study that carefully documents Husserl’s shifting positions and also includes an account of C-manuscript material, see Toine Kortooms, Phenomenology of Time: Edmund Husserl’s Analysis of Time-Consciousness (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2002). These limits of de Warren’s text, which he himself acknowledges, do not diminish its success on its own terms.

2 Iso Kern, “The Three Ways to the Transcendental Reduction in the Philosophy of Edmund Husserl,” in Husserl: Expositions and Appraisals, ed. P. McCormick and F. Ellison (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame, 1977), pp. 126-149. Kern refers to the third path as the way through intentional psychology.

3 For a recent Husserlian attempt to identify the heart of pre-reflective consciousness with a non-temporal, even eternal, awareness of time, see J. G. Hart, Who One Is, Book 1: Meontology of the “I”: A Transcendental Phenomenology (Dordrecht: Springer, 2009), pp. 429-438. De Warren never seriously entertains the idea that the awareness of time might be founded in an experience of eternity.

4 Here, de Warren draws on both the Bernau Manuscipts (Husserliana XXXIII) and Husserl’s investigations into Phantasie, Bildbewustsein and Erinnerung collected in Husserliana XXIII.

5 For a discussion of general fulfillment and particular fulfillment in protentional consciousness as presented in the Bernau Manuscripts, see the aforementioned work of Toine Kortoom, Phenomenology of Time, pp. 158-174.