Husserl's Phenomenology: Knowledge, Objectivity and Others

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Kevin Hermberg, Husserl's Phenomenology: Knowledge, Objectivity and Others, Continuum, 2006, 145pp., $122.83 (hbk), ISBN 0826489583.

Reviewed by Nicolas de Warren, Wellesley College


Recent reappraisals of transcendental phenomenology have increasingly underscored and explored the central role of inter-subjectivity for Husserl's brand of transcendental idealism. Though little of Husserl's interest in inter-subjectivity surfaced in his published writings (with the exception of the Cartesian Meditations), this interest is apparent in Husserl’s unusually impressive quantity of manuscripts, many of which are available in three hefty Husserliana (XIII-XV) volumes published in 1973. This re-discovery of transcendental inter-subjectivity forcefully challenges a misconstrued Cartesian image of phenomenology that inexplicably still plagues the reception of Husserl's seminal thinking. For Husserl, inter-subjectivity is both a constituted phenomenon in need of clarification and a constituting monadic multiplicity that contributes decisively to the objective world's transcendence, open to all and any possible experiencing subject.

Against this backdrop, Kevin Hermberg's Husserl's Phenomenology: Knowledge, Objectivity and Others considers the role of inter-subjectivity in Husserl's transcendental thinking in Ideas I, Cartesian Meditations and The Crisis of the European Sciences.  Hermberg offers a "new reading" focusing on the relation between inter-subjectivity and knowledge in the progression of Husserl's thinking. Rather than approach transcendental inter-subjectivity from the Fifth Cartesian Meditation's refutation of solipsism or argue for the necessary expansion of transcendental subjectivity to inter-subjectivity, Hermberg seeks to correct what he considers a neglected facet of Husserl's many-faceted inter-subjectivity: the constitutive role of empathy for the objectivity of knowledge. On this reading, "empathy is related to knowledge" (xi) in two ways: it contributes to the solidification of acquired knowledge and it gives an individual subject access to knowledge gained by other subjects, thus extending an individual's knowledge. In following Hermberg's reading, we are invited to recognize Husserl's "social epistemology." And yet, even though Husserl opened the field of social epistemology, his dedication to a transcendental idea of philosophy prevented him, as is often said of Husserl's numerous other discoveries, from recognizing what others recognize in his own thinking.

Chapter One contains a set of preliminary discussions meant to frame the argument of the book. A clarification of two central terms (objective and empathy) fixes the thought that "what Husserl was working to explore" (10) was the foundation of knowledge as objective and valid for everyone. Although Hermberg acknowledges recent scholarship on inter-subjectivity that relies extensively on Husserl's research manuscripts, he decides not to include these materials; only with texts

prepared for publication [by Husserl] … [can one] be assured that (at least at the time of publication) the views offered in the text represent views he [Husserl] would have been willing to defend -- an assurance not always available when studying the working papers (11).

 While it is true that reliance on Husserl's research manuscripts brings additional interpretative responsibilities, this decision seems to me forced, since many of the views explored in the research manuscripts are in fact more defensible, but also richer in their phenomenological yield.

In Chapter Two, Hermberg aims to make explicit a connection between objective validity and empathy in Ideas I. Hermberg usefully distinguishes between three senses of "objective": as an object of an individual consciousness; as an object for any possible subject; as grounded in apodictic evidence, as objectively valid for any possible subject (17). Husserl thus recognizes the inherent reference to inter-subjectivity in the meaning of objectivity, even though he did not explicitly connect objective knowledge and empathy in Ideas I, as Hermberg admits. In fact, in the 1931 preface to the (first) English translation of Ideas I, Husserl acknowledges the neglect of inter-subjectivity, and thus the incompleteness of Ideas I. Nevertheless, Hermberg argues that the solidification thesis is implicit in Ideas I, whereas the extension thesis is not.

In order to demonstrate this implicit connection between knowledge and empathy, Hermberg distinguishes three strands within Husserl's central concept of evidence, "adequate, de facto apodicticity, de jure apodicticity" (25), even if Husserl does not explicitly draw a distinction between de facto and de jure apodicticity. As Hermberg qualifies:  "I am not suggesting that Husserl emphasized this distinction in Ideas" (30). Hermberg further claims that de facto apodicticity is "the correlate of self-givenness," whereas de jure apodicticity is "the correlate of a judgment linked with a linguistic formulation of de facto evidence (and, perhaps, an intersubjective critique)" (28). This bond between de jure apodicticity and predicative judgment sets up a connection between inter-subjectivity and empathy. As Hermberg writes:

de jure evidence is subject to further criticism (because once something has been predicated it is there to be criticized either by the original subject or by Others), and that criticism makes it possible to move up the path of certainty toward adequacy by taking into account as many of the possible points of view as possible (30)

Hermberg supports this linking of predication with de jure apodicticity with reference to a passage from Ideas I that in fact points in another direction. Husserl writes that the consciousness of necessity in the particular form of judgment is the "particularization of an eidetic universality" (29; Ideas I, 60). In light of this reference, Hermberg has yet to demonstrate how empathy would, or could, contribute to the method of eidetic variation and Wesenschau. Contrary to Hermberg's implied position, eidetic variation cannot be seen as a process of taking into account as many possible views of other subjects, as Husserl explicitly argues in the Cartesian Meditations, § 34. A distinction needs to be made between Husserl's thesis that perceptual objects are always given in different perspectives, and thus open to the perspectives of other subjects, and the thesis that eidetic variation arrives at the a priori structure of an object's givenness. The space of possibility invoked in the first thesis is distinct from, yet over-laps with, the space of possibility invoked in the second thesis.

Chapter Three addresses Husserl's account of empathy and inter-subjectivity in the Cartesian Meditations. Hermberg reminds us that the analysis of empathy -- Husserl's account for how I experience the other as another subjectivity -- does not simply respond to the objection of solipsism; "since it is a requirement for intersubjectivity, empathy is a condition of possibility for any knowledge of external, transcendent objects or the world whatsoever" (41). In his subsequent discussion, Hermberg wrongly attributes to Husserl a suspiciously Cartesian-looking thought, when he writes: "The pure ego is, then, the source of the pre-predicative certainty (i.e., de facto apodicticity) on which judgments can be grounded and thus Objectively valid science can be developed" (45). Yet, Husserl distinctly characterizes pure consciousness as a field of transcendental experience and, in this manner, repudiates the Cartesian identification of the ego as a source of certainty. In the Cartesian Meditations, Husserl remarks that Cartesian evidence of the ego cogito is "without fruit" (CM, § 13). Indeed, it is only the transcendental reduction that discloses transcendental subjectivity as an opening ("field") in which the objects are given ("experienced") in their essential ("eidetic") structures of intentionality (the noetic-noematic apriori correlation). It is, therefore, not the case, as Hermberg writes, that "one is able to gain certainty … at the expense of the 'thereness for everyone' of Objectivity," precisely because the pure ego is not a "kernel" of truth, as Husserl again explicitly notes in his critique of Descartes (cf. Cartesian Meditations, § 10).

Nevertheless, Hermberg rightly underlines the connection between inter-subjectivity and the transcendence of the world that guides Husserl's Fifth Meditation. Of the notable moments in his careful consideration of Husserl's analysis of empathy, Hermberg handles intelligently the contested difference between the egological and primordial reductions by arguing that the primordial reduction takes root within the field uncovered by the egological reduction. The primordial reduction discloses the embodiment of the pure consciousness. With this primordial embodiment in view, Husserl develops his constitutive analysis of empathy. Hermberg's discussion is here solid; his recognition that Husserl's account operates with two senses of association (the pairing of association and the pairing of similarity) is especially helpful. As Hermberg stresses, "my experience of the Other must be mediated and the 'mechanics' of that mediation is the simultaneous pair of pairings" (63). On this basis, "the Other is, then, both the first real object that transcends the mediating ego and the condition of possibility of other independent and transcendent Objects" (66). Despite this insight, Hermberg argues that the Fifth Meditation "ignores the genesis of the ego," even if the Cartesian Meditations manages to "fill the gap left by the Ideas," namely, the gap of inter-subjectivity (67). Contrary to Hermberg's claim that "such genesis is kept out of the picture by the reduction to the sphere of ownness," the Fourth Meditation deals explicitly with this theme, and even identifies temporality as the "universal form of all egological genesis" (§ 37). And while it is true that Husserl does not discuss the genesis of the alter-ego, nor broach the genesis of empathy in the formation of the ego (cf. Husserl's interesting writings on the mother-child relationship in Hua XV), Hermberg himself never returns in his book to the genesis of the ego supposedly ignored in the Fifth Meditation. Ultimately, a "tension" defines the Cartesian Meditations since Husserl still "prioritized the meditating ego over Others" in his refutation of solipsism (69).  What is lacking is the "possibility of attaining" apodicticity through communication -- but why this issue is identical with the reservation that Husserl "ignores the genesis of the ego" is to me unclear.

In Chapter Four, Hermberg turns to The Crisis of the European Sciences in search of the possibility of communication signaled at the end of Chapter Three. As with his reading of Ideas I, Hermberg begins by reminding his readers that Husserl did not "really" ask "the question of the possibility of the experience of Others" in the Crisis (72). What Husserl does investigate is the communication of apodicticty and the "pre-awareness of Others and the world" (72). Hermberg emphasizes the relation between scientific evidence and the evidence of the life-world. Strangely, however, Hermberg characterizes this foundational relationship in the following terms: "the evidence of the sciences is built upon the evidence of the life-world in which we experience things themselves-there" (73). This statement cannot stand without appropriate qualification, since it is misleading to speak of the life-world as the "experience of things themselves-there." The life-world is a pre-given horizon of meaning from which perceptual things are disclosed in experience. This primordial evidence of the life-world, on the basis of which the accomplishment of intentionality rests, "includes an intersubjective layer" (78). All too rapidly, Hermberg delivers the conclusion: "so, inter-subjectivity is a condition of the possibility of Objective valid knowledge," but also the condition of empathy (79). A "sort" of pre-given inter-subjectivity is exactly, on this reading, what Husserl presupposed in Ideas I and the Cartesian Meditations. What "sort" of inter-subjectivity Hermberg has in mind remains, however, woefully unexplored. Hermberg wants to say that this foundational inter-subjectivity is not constituted on the basis of empathy, yet the quote cited as evidence for his proposal actually speaks against it. He cites Husserl: "every ego is already implied in advance by way of empathy and empathy-horizon" (79). However, this reference does not support Hermberg's reading: "So, the experience and theory of empathy uncover an intersubjectivity already there, they don't constitute the intersubjectivity" (79). Whereas Husserl speaks (in the cited passage) of empathy and empathy-horizon, Hermberg divides empathy from its horizon. As he writes immediately after Husserl's cited text: "The empathy-horizon is that horizon against which empathy can occur, whether one is actively aware of the horizon or not" (79). What justifies this division? Hermberg reaches for additional textual support, yet betrays his own principle of avoiding research manuscripts, due to their unreliability, by citing a passage from the C-manuscripts; but even this passage does not reinforce Hermberg's point, since this passages needs to be read with reference to the temporality of the empathy in its structure of empathy-horizons. The sense of "already there" must be understood genetically, or even, based on this singular reference to the C-manuscripts, to what is often called Husserl's "generative phenomenology."

Hermberg's presumed discovery of a pre-empathetic intersubjectivity (disclosed but not constituted in empathy) leads to the further claim that the act of empathy, as a "questioning back" to sedimentated meaning, is "possible because Objectivity can be constituted linguistically" (80). In support of this claim, we are directed to Husserl's essay on the origin of geometry. On this reading, "The Origin of Geometry shows how predication and the sedimentation in documents of an object of consciousness can make Objectivity possible" (87). This claim fulfills what had been identified earlier in Ideas I and its implicit distinction between de facto and de jure apodicticity. As Hermberg notes, "the movement towards adequacy involves predication, and thus the experiencing of Others" (emphasis mine, 32). Hermberg's reading is here circular. On the one hand, he argues that acts of empathy (for example, "questioning back") are possible due to the linguistically constituted objectivity; on the other hand, this linguistic constitution of objectivity, in communication, is itself an "empathetic experience" (87). In fact, it has not been shown how communication is an "empathetic" experience (Husserl's discussion of sign and meaning in the First Logical Investigation is surprisingly omitted from this discussion). Moreover, it is Husserl's emphatic position that neither perceptual objectivities nor predication are constituted linguistically (cf. Experience and Judgment). Hermberg needs to discriminate between different kinds of objectivities (idealized geometric objects, perceptual objects, imaginary objects, etc.) and check his unquestioned move to generalize the lesson of the origin essay to all forms of objects.

In Chapter Five, Hermberg concludes his reading that in Husserl two roles of empathy are at work in the "attainment and solidification of knowledge" (95). In my judgement, as discussed above, there are considerable issues with Hermberg's argument. The monadic dimension of inter-subjectivity, and the crucial problem of compossibility, plays a significant role in how ideal and cultural objects are accessible to a plurality of subjects; yet, as with other relevant aspects of Husserl's thinking, Hermberg fails to consider this significant piece in the puzzle of Husserlian inter-subjectivity. The limitations of Hermberg's study might also be self-imposed. For example, with his reading of Ideas I, Hermberg argues that Husserl "emphasizes a reliance on empathy" for the "solidification" of knowledge, yet equally grants that this is not the emphasis of Ideas I ("Although it is not the emphasis in Ideas, but rather left unsaid") (99). How Ideas I can emphasize without emphasizing is indeed a subtlety of hermeneutical interpretation. As a conclusion to his study, Hermberg remarks that Husserl considered phenomenology as a transcendental philosophy to the extent that it was committed to revealing the "ultimate sources" of knowledge. This transcendental thought, however, is "in tension" with Husserl's commitment to the inter-subjective requirement of knowledge. Caught within this tension, Husserl was "wandering between two worlds": the world of social epistemology and the world of "atomistic knowledge." Standing before both doors, Husserl "never definitively answered the question" of whether phenomenology should emphasize the individual subject or the inter-subjective life-world. Hermberg's own sympathies for the turn to inter-subjectivity, however, forces the decision in another manner, for whereas Husserl did indeed open the door to inter-subjectivity, this inter-subjective turn -- for Hermberg -- renders "questionable" the transcendental claim of philosophy (105). On the contrary, as Husserl explicitly argues in the Cartesian Meditations, and elsewhere, we do not truly understand transcendental phenomenology until we truly understand transcendental inter-subjectivity.