Idealism and Praxis: The Philosophy of Nicholas Rescher

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Michele Marsonet, Idealism and Praxis: The Philosophy of Nicholas Rescher, Ontos, 2008, 245pp., €89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793992.

Reviewed by Don Ihde, Stony Brook University


Idealism and Praxis is the third volume in a series, Reading Rescher, and the second by Michele Marsonet, Dean of the faculty of arts and professor in the philosophy of science department at Genoa University, Italy. Marsonet, a University of Pittsburgh Ph.D., was both a graduate student and later a Visiting Scholar at the Pittsburgh Center for Philosophy of Science during the era when Nicholas Rescher, Wilfrid Sellars and others were at their most active. He wants this volume to be a more succinct and more comprehensive introduction to the full span of Rescher's work -- and this is no easy task! Marsonet notes in his introduction, "The most common objection raised against Rescher is the following: 'He writes too much' (it is, indeed, a leitmotiv of all those unwilling to discuss his ideas). But is it a serious philosophical objection?" (iv) And, it is true that Rescher is one of the most prolific philosophic writers of the contemporary era. Now eighty, he has published over 120 books (eight books plus collected papers in 2005 alone) which is a rate of around one and a half books for every year of his life. Thus Marsonet's task is clearly an enormous one.

The context in which Marsonet chooses to situate Rescher is that which he and others describe as neopragmatism, the post-classical pragmatism associated largely with analytic philosophies. And while Marsonet does not use this term, what he shows through various surveys of the main neopragmatist (or post-analytic) philosophers is that Rescher is what in economics would be called a "contrarian." Thus it is not only the sheer volume of Rescher's output which poses a problem, but also the often contrary stances which Rescher takes against so many of his peers. But, before plunging into what I consider to be the most fun reading in Idealism and Praxis, I will provide a short summary of the book’s contents.

Marsonet begins with the history of pragmatism, largely in the 20th century, followed by the incoming 20th century positivist and analytic movements. Chapter One is an excellent and clear descriptive analysis of the arrival of positivist and analytic philosophy, particularly philosophy of science, which quickly produced a decline and displacement of classical pragmatism. This analysis is followed by a broad introduction of many of the main characters, including Rescher as a key figure, in the later mid-century analytic re-adoption of pragmatism, and on to the 'Rise and Fall of Analytic Philosophy.' Marsonet finds that the primacy of practice in some ways holds the 'varieties of pragmatism' together.

Rescher's contrarian stance begins to emerge in his idealistic position, hardly a popular notion when compared to the anti-metaphysical, anti-idealist ideology of mainstream logical and linguistic philosophy of the time. Marsonet provides thematic analyses of all the main topics of philosophy: ontology, rationality, truth, knowledge, metaphysics, science and its limits, as well as ethics and political philosophy. This is, as Rescher claims in his foreword, a tour de force.

Now to the meat. In his history Marsonet links logical empiricism and analytic philosophy. Frege takes linguistic analysis to be the main, even possibly exclusive, task of philosophy together with the science-centered aspects of logical empiricism, both movements which became historically dominant in American philosophy in the early-mid 20th century. Marsonet claims that this complex has both an analytic ideology and an analytic methodology whose trajectories he will trace out. But I would claim he misses an equally important analytic sociology (or culture) which has also been in play. For example, if we return to the criticism that Rescher writes too much, Marsonet points out that it was analytic philosophy itself which set up the paradigm that philosophers must write as little as possible, which Marsonet recognizes has not been the case in much of the wider history of philosophy which has writers even more prolific than Rescher. (Husserl, for example, with his 45,000 pages of manuscripts, easily equals or exceeds Rescher.) I cite this observation because the article from which I learned of Rescher was his famous entry in the American Philosophical Quarterly in which he reviewed the citations of the major American and European philosophers of mid-twentieth century and in which he pointed out the far vaster presence and notation given to the Europeans (Heidegger, Habermas, et. al., compared to Quine, Sellars, et. al.). Such an observation surely must not have been appreciated at the time which was at the beginning of the pluralist movement which challenged the monolithic state of much American philosophy in the seventies.

I now turn to the cast of characters and the drama of agreements and disagreements which provide so much of the dynamic for this book. Rescher, in his foreword, admits that much of his writing has to do with disagreements he finds with many of his contemporaries -- note whom he lists: Davidson, Feyerabend, Habermas, Popper, Putnam, Kripke, and above all, Rorty. His interpreter, however, emphasizes a somewhat different list, partly because he focuses on issues bearing more directly upon pragmatism, but also because he focuses on Rescher's increasing distancing of himself from analytic philosophy. Marsonet's main actors are: Rorty (above all), Quine, Sellars (to a lesser extent), Davidson, and Habermas (but only when social-political philosophy becomes the theme). In the background, of course, the godfathers of pragmatism -- Dewey foremost, James, Peirce, C.I. Lewis -- play prominent roles.

As I was reading Idealism and Praxis, I recalled Rorty's famous Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979). When it appeared, it was reviewed by virtually every major journal and intellectual magazine, sometimes reviled since Rorty was pronouncing analytic philosophy's era over but it was actually read and discussed. So much of the 'buzz' about Mirror concerned how analytic philosophy had come to an end, how an edifying or hermeneutic philosophy was replacing it with the result that Rorty was effectively 'exiled' by some analytic philosophers. He ended his days in Comparative Literature at Stanford. When I read it, however, I discovered it was much more about how Sellars, Quine and Davidson had abandoned the older classical analysis and effectively became neopragmatists. Marsonet revisits this same scene, but from a later, more contemporary perspective, one in which Rescher plays a much larger role. In a sense then Idealism and Praxis is something of a mirror of Mirror. Marsonet's Rescher is clearly the more faithful pragmatist in this cast of characters, a point Marsonet dramatically and consistently makes.

As noted, Marsonet pays more attention to Rescher and Rorty than to most others, and following Rescher, distinguishes a neopragmatism of the left (Rorty) from a neopragmatism of the right (Rescher). Rescher worries that the leftist form (fully anti-foundationalist, anti-essentialist, and most echoing Dewey in certain respects) comes close to a relativism. All Rorty's "conversations" are equalized, thus displacing philosophy -- and science as well -- from any privileged position. But, as Marsonet recognizes, Rorty did retain one central ideological tenet from analytic philosophy: the linguistically centered form of analysis and communication. Rescher, in contrast, remained closer to asserting that science is the best of all the human activities that produce knowledge. For Rescher, although science’s perfectibility can only be found in an ideality, scientific practice retained its central role. And contrary to Rorty, Rescher does not privilege linguisticality. Here, if one takes the left/right neopragmatism described by Marsonet, or my contrast of Ideality and Praxis/Mirror of Nature image, both of us agree that Rorty and Rescher are polar outlying figures in contemporary neopragmatism. And both end up in some degree further marginalized from the dominant forms of still vestigially analytic neopragmatism.

Marsonet also does an excellent job of analyzing this dominant middle when he compares Quine, Davidson, and Sellars to Rescher. I recommend this book precisely because it does its job well by looking at the spectrum of neopragmatism, locating the central figures therein, and making clear the intellectual history of those 20th century philosophical movements. I would comment, however, that Marsonet himself remains captured in some degree by the culture of analytic philosophy. That is (with one short exception where he recognizes that by mid-century there were competing strands of philosophy, particularly the influxes of 'continental' philosophies which drew and continue to draw larger audiences) his account remains almost entirely internalist (Habermas is the one exception here, although his Habermas is largely a pragmatist Habermas). Thus the other major externalist challenge, which relates powerfully to the role and interpretation of science and philosophy of science, was the arrival of a spectrum of new sociologies of science, science studies, philosophy of technology, and feminist critics of science. The mid-late century challenges to both older philosophy of science and the privilege of science for logical empiricism and neopragmatism remain invisible here.

Finally, I do feel compelled to make a minor complaint -- there has been some failure of copy-editing/proof-reading. There are misspellings and typos every few pages, a flaw for a book published by one of many European academic presses which charge such high prices for books which should be read by more rather than fewer readers.