Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism: The Philosophy of Ella Lyman Cabot

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John J. Kaag, Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism: The Philosophy of Ella Lyman Cabot, Lexington Books, 2011, 223pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739167809.

Reviewed by Maurice Hamington, Metropolitan State College of Denver


Overall, John Kaag packs a comprehensive introduction to the philosophy of Ella Lyman Cabot (1855-1934) into a relatively slim volume, Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism: The Philosophy of Ella Lyman Cabot. More than an isolated discussion of Cabot's intellectual legacy, this volume carefully attends to Cabot's place among the classical American pragmatist philosophers as well as provides comparative analysis with the work of other significant late nineteenth- and early twentieth-century women thinkers such as Mary Parker Follett and Jane Addams. Kaag is quite intentional in addressing the larger social dynamics caught up in the philosophy of Cabot: "My intent in writing this book is to explore the intersection of philosophy, religion, and gender, three forces that continue to quietly determine our lives." (x) The text includes biographical contextualization, a thorough consideration of Cabot's analysis of various topics, and forty-one pages of selections from Cabot's work. Kaag's writing is clear and non-jargon laden, so the book will be of interest to specialists in American philosophy as well as mature undergraduates and non-specialized readers. The juxtaposition of idealism and pragmatism in Cabot's thought makes for an intriguing negotiation of what some might view as countervailing perspectives.

Kaag's Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism is indicative of the evolution and maturity of the contemporary resurgence of interest in American philosophy. Ostensibly inspired by Richard Rorty's work in the 1970s and Cornel West's work in the 1980s, American philosophy has gained ground since its decline in the post World War I era, but it remains a minority position among U.S. professional philosophers. As more scholars have been attracted to American philosophy, new intellectual connections have emerged. The Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy has actively encouraged interdisciplinary presentations at its annual meetings.

One outgrowth of these new connections has been strong ties to feminist thought and the creation of the subfield "feminist pragmatism." The work of feminist pragmatists includes the identification and elaboration of feminist themes in classical American philosophers such as John Dewey and William James, as well as the reclaiming of the writings of forgotten women theorists as philosophers. The torchbearer for some of these early efforts is Jane Addams (1860-1935). For decades Addams was characterized as an activist rather than holding the intellectual esteem of her male contemporaries. The efforts of Charlene Haddock Seigfield, Marilyn Fischer, Judy Whipps, and others has altered that perception of Addams who is now viewed as having a rich intellectual legacy, at least among contemporary American philosophers. However, while Addams' work deserves the attention it has been getting, there are a number of women such as Charlotte Perkins Gilman, Emily Greene Balch, and Mary Parker Follett who have a significant although largely overlooked contribution to philosophical scholarship. Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism makes further inroads into a more inclusive understanding of American philosophy at the turn of the last century. Furthermore, Kaag represents a "widening of the circle" in terms of those who are engaging in the traditional feminist process of rediscovering lost voices. Self-described feminist philosophers have done much of the previous work of recovery. Kaag does not overtly identify as a feminist and yet he applies feminist analysis and language with significant skill. Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism is a further sign of the maturing and mainstreaming of feminist pragmatism.

The preface to the book lays out a tripartite set of goals for the volume. First, Kaag situates Cabot as a figure of philosophical import. Like Addams before her, Cabot's legacy has been limited to that of activist through an insidious form of sexism that historically characterized men as thinking and women as acting. Second, Kaag utilizes unpublished texts including student notebooks to demonstrate that Cabot was figuratively in conversation with the significant philosophers of her day. The gender dynamics of the time period hindered her ability to have many direct intellectual conversations with those philosophers. Finally, Kaag offers the work of Cabot as an independent root of American philosophy: "Cabot's treatment of marriage, personal growth, unity, risk, loyalty, political unity, and international relations is expressed in, and as, a unique composition." (xiii)

The first chapter provides a much-needed introduction to Cabot's life since her biography is relatively unknown. Increasingly, contemporary philosophers have recognized the importance of contextualizing the origins of intellectual work. Cabot's social philosophy cannot be divorced from the era in which she lived and in particular the Progressive milieu. Kaag makes this brief account of her life particularly fascinating by highlighting Ella Lyman's unique marriage to Richard Cabot, who was a physician, educator, social worker, and philosopher. Given the gender inequities of the time including the prescribed and limited vocational choices for women (not to mention the Victorian mores), Cabot negotiated that their marriage include a prenuptial agreement that called for celibacy. Kaag describes, "This self-restraint would be exercised in the name of self-liberation -- Ella's liberation." (20) Her release from gender roles, the support of her intellectual husband as well as her father, and the privilege that comes from wealth, conspired to allow Cabot to devote herself to philosophical pursuits resulting in six published books on ethics and education over the course of their marriage. It was her intellectual relationship to Richard Cabot that sustained her thirst for philosophy until she entered formal training in 1890 at Radcliffe College.

Chapter 2 is one of several chapters that had an earlier version published in the Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society. Here Kaag enters the fray on the subject of who can be characterized as a philosopher and, by extension, what constitutes philosophy. Kaag places Cabot's early work (1887 to 1902) in dialogue with a number of significant American scholars including Josiah Royce and Mary Parker Follett. Of particular interest are the subjects of unity and growth. I found a note highlighted by Kaag in one of Cabot's unpublished notebooks intriguing: "The art of living is becoming other people." (39) Cabot's relational approach to morality and growth is revealed in this statement. Kaag refers to this quote because it is written in 1890, well before Royce developed his relational notions of loyalty and communities of interpretation. Kaag indicates that this is a theme that he will return to throughout the volume and he does.

Chapter 3 demonstrates why Idealism, Feminism, and Pragmatism is a good read for the nonspecialist. Kaag endeavors to situate Cabot as taking a mediating position between Charles Sanders Peirce's notion of tychism (or absolute chance) and Royce's determinism. Kaag does not assume the reader's knowledge of these philosophic positions and so spends considerable attention explaining tychism and its historical development. For Peirce, indeterminacy is so strong that he challenges causal relationships and contends that tychism must be taken into consideration in theories of knowledge and value. In a witty personal anecdote, Kaag interjects into this chapter how his own "chance encounters" with references to "Mrs. Cabot" in his archival work directed elsewhere kept bringing him back to this enigmatic figure and eventually consumed the major focus of his project resulting in this book. (73) Although Peirce's tychism pushed him toward deeper metaphysical exploration, Cabot sought to stay grounded in addressing everyday ethics. She postulated human imagination as the vehicle necessary to navigate the vicissitudes of a world of chance.

Imagination becomes the lynchpin for Cabot's ethics and is further developed in chapter 4. Kaag describes, "Her Everyday Ethics (1906) takes up the concept of the imagination as a central topic and explains the ways in which it might enable sympathy, loyalty, social open-mindedness, and moral foresight." (87) Everyday Ethics, perhaps the work that Cabot is best known for, is described by Kaag as part "treatise, manifesto, journalistic reflection, and teacher's manual." To situate Cabot's use of imagination as a moral faculty, Kaag returns to the much discussed interchange between David Hume and Immanuel Kant. (88) Furthermore, in chapter 4, Cabot's work on moral imagination is placed in dialogue with Dewey, Emerson, and Addams. For Cabot, if indeed the art of living is becoming other people, then the moral imagination becomes the vehicle of the requisite empathetic connection. Kaag is not afraid to critique Cabot's thoroughgoing faith in the imaginative capacity to overcome social division and strive. He recounts Cabot's visit to Chicago's Hull House and Jane Addams. Cabot is confronted with circumstances -- the poverty, chaos, and diversity of the Hull House neighborhood -- that she lacks the resources to imaginatively comprehend. Although Addams also emphasizes sympathy, she ties it to direct knowledge of difference that comes with physical presence. Kaag describes, "Addams takes an alternative approach to moral relations, occasionally emphasizing an asymmetric relationship in which individual difference cannot be fully overcome by way of the imagination." (107)

In Chapter 5, Kaag more directly takes up the issue of Cabot's relation to feminism. Cabot, like many women of her day, would not overtly claim the mantle of feminism, but her contribution to thinking about women was clearly feminist in sentiment. Again, taking a strong contextual approach, Kaag begins the chapter by exploring John Stuart Mill's The Subjection of Women and the American pragmatist reaction to the text. Far from supporting it, the men of the classical American pragmatist era found fault with The Subjection of Women because of its threat to the social order as well as their underlying sexist beliefs, despite the fact that their philosophical ideals were ostensibly "feminist-friendly." Cabot maintained a forty-year celibate marriage that gave her freedoms beyond what Mill sought. In this regard, Ella's abilities and belief that women were capable of much more than society allowed influenced her husband. Richard, a physician, developed a "work cure" for women who suffered from "nervous prostration and chronic anxiety." Kaag finds in Cabot's writing a strong notion of a "duty to self-expression," which signifies her implicit feminism as women's social roles often limited expression. One of my few criticisms of Idealism, Feminism, and Pragmatism, is that Kaag indicates that Cabot would have distanced herself from contemporary feminist care ethics because of its emphasis on altruism and self sacrifice. (127) Although this is a common characterization of care ethics, it fails to capture the depth of contemporary care theory. Rather than altruism and self-sacrifice as a central tenet of care ethics, it is relationality that is at its core. Care theory is currently enjoying broad-based exploration from a variety of feminists and non-feminist scholars who recognize the care of the self as an integral component of the approach. Cabot, as well as Dewey and Addams, have many fruitful points of contact with care theory.

An examination of the later writings of Cabot on issues of peace and moral education are the topic of the sixth chapter. Building upon her work on imagination, and consistent with her idealism, Cabot develops a notion of ethical imitation anchored to "ethical exemplars." According to Kaag, "She believed that ideas mattered in the course of human activity and that ethical education depends as much on moral vision (eido) as it does on forceful action." (158) Cabot writes about these exemplars in the context of moral education for children as well as her writing for adults. She posits that the moral imitation of heroes strengthens and sustains a vibrant democracy. What Kaag finds interesting about the moral heroes described by Cabot is the range of figures employed. Cabot selected traditional and well-known figures such as Dorethea Dix, Clara Barton, Florence Nightingale, and Charles Darwin (147) as well as lesser-known figures and perhaps controversial figures such as Cecil Rhodes, Samuel May, and Robert Shaw. Cabot's selection of moral heroes, and the aspects of their lives she highlights, is quite telling in their feminist, anti-racist, and peace orientation.

Kaag ends his analysis of Cabot's philosophy in Chapter 8 with a return to a discussion of the relationship between her idealism and her pragmatism. Again, Kaag does an excellent job of maintaining the reader's narrative interest as well as her intellectual interest. In the first chapter, Kaag's discussion of the Cabots' celibate marriage was an intriguing attention grabber that provided important insight into the circumstances surrounding Ella Lyman Cabot's ability to write philosophy. In Chapter 8, Kaag frames the discussion around revealing a dark secret in the life of Richard Cabot that had a profound effect on the ethical outlook and writing of both Ella and Richard. This chapter is about failures and lost causes that might otherwise shatter idealism but are moments of growth when pragmatism is the partner of idealism. Kaag describes, "Cabot attempts to shift idealism away from its traditional rendering as being monistic and dogmatic toward a way of thinking that emphasizes possibility without foregoing purpose." (174)

If Kaag's thoughtful analysis and background were not enough to whet the appetite of the reader to further study the works of Ella Lyman Cabot, Kaag includes an appendix with snippets from a variety of her writings, including poetry, selected unpublished journal entries and correspondence, as well as philosophical material. Idealism, Pragmatism, and Feminism is really a must read for anyone interested in American philosophy and it makes an important contribution to the contemporary process of expanding the cannon of significant thinkers in the pragmatist tradition.