Idealism: The History of a Philosophy

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Jeremy Dunham, Iain Hamilton Grant, and Sean Watson, Idealism: The History of a Philosophy, Acumen, 2011, 334pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773538375.

Reviewed by Dietmar Heidemann, University of Luxembourg


This book provides a comprehensive overview of the history of philosophical idealism from ancient to contemporary philosophy. The history of idealism presented by Jeremy Dunham, Iain Hamilton Grant, and Sean Watson covers ancient philosophy (Parmenides, Plato, Neoplatonism), early modern philosophy (rationalism and empiricism), German idealism, British idealism, and various versions of idealism pertinent in late-twentieth-century science, contemporary analytic and postmodern philosophy. The volume is not just ahistory of philosophy but the history of a philosophy. That is to say, the authors do not claim that the history of philosophy is to be reconstructed in terms of idealism as its leading thread. This would, of course, mean to just ignore concurrent movements, approaches and doctrines throughout the history of philosophy. The claim rather is that idealism itself must be conceived of in the light of its long lasting history, which didn't come to an end in the nineteenth century but stretches into present philosophy.

As Dunham, Grant, and Watson see it, contemporary philosophy shows a growing interest in idealism and its reception in recent philosophy. This is the primary motivation for them to compose a historical survey of idealist theories. They are certainly right in claiming that philosophical research, be it historical or systematic, is in need of such a survey. At the same time, they acknowledge the danger of being selective with respect to the idealist theories they consider since the history of idealism is simply too rich for a normal length book project. On the other hand, they surprisingly ignore medieval philosophy altogether as they obviously think that it is not part of that history, contrary to what recent research has demonstrated.[1] Besides the historical limitation of the volume, the authors decided to focus on the metaphysical dimensions of idealism as well as the natural sciences, while not putting too much emphasis on ethical and political aspects of the problem (p. 2). In view of the theoretical context the idea of "idealism" originates in, this decision proves to be well-founded.

The book's strength is undoubtedly that it highlights theories and historical contexts that one must regard as crucial for understanding what philosophical idealism amounts to. This is especially so in the chapters on idealism in early modern philosophy and -- disregarded by many scholars for a long time -- British idealism. With respect to the latter, it is particularly illuminating to see how German idealist thought is taken up and further developed by Bradley, McTaggert, Bosanquet, et al. and what their contribution to the history of idealism is. However, one major weakness of the book cannot be overlooked. The authors are aware of the difficulty that there are certain views traditionally associated with idealism such as anti-realism and anti-naturalism (pp. 4-6), and that these views are, among others, responsible for persistent misconceptions of idealism (pp. 201-209), e.g., the claim that external reality does not exist or that nature is mental. But they do not provide any particular definition or explication of the concept "idealism" itself. As this concept emerges in early modern philosophy and since it has had a specific theoretical meaning ever since, it would have been helpful if they had laid out the historical background of the term and profiled the major meanings of the various idealist doctrines on the market.[2] They then could have shown the differences between the various versions of idealism that can be found throughout the history of philosophy. Doing that would have made it less difficult for the reader to know which particular kind of idealism the authors are referring to.

Chapter One makes the controversial claim that there is idealism in ancient philosophy and that Parmenides is its origin. This claim is controversial in light of Miles Burnyeat's well-known thesis that there is no such thing as idealism in ancient philosophy. Burnyeat is not pointing to the fact that the concept of idealism only appears in modern philosophy, but that ancient philosophy is simply unaware of the very idea of idealism. However, as the authors make clear, Burnyeat's understanding of "idealism" is as one-sided as Moore's rather awkward view according to which idealism takes the universe to be spiritual (p. 10). Contrary to Burnyeat's views, the authors believe that Parmenides is an idealist mainly because he distinguishes between the way of truth and the way of appearance and famously claimed that what is not cannot be thought. The various "idealist" interpretations of the Parmenidean poem (by, among others, Plato, Plotinus, Bradley, Heidegger and Sprigge) the authors mention (pp. 13-18), however, are unsupportive in the end since they do not clarify what specific kind of idealism Parmenidean idealism is, i.e., whether it is epistemological, ontological, metaphysical, conceptual etc.

The same goes for the section on Plato (pp. 19-24). Although Dunham, Grant, and Watson insightfully outline Plato's conception of "difference" in the Sophist, the ontological status of the idea and the doctrine of participation, they do not succeed in clarifying what kind of idealism Plato subscribes to. In view of the common 'realist' interpretation of Plato's doctrine of the ideas, this would have been particularly helpful, as it also would have been with respect to Plotinus and Neoplatonism (pp. 24-31). Here again the label "idealism" is simply too unspecific, e.g., in the characterization of Plotinus' metaphysics as "precursor of the subjective idealisms found in Berkeley or in Fichte," who apparently take reality to be mind dependent (p. 25). If one acknowledges the modern origin of the concept "idealism", the statement that "Neoplatonism sets out the standard for all subsequent developments in idealist philosophy" (p. 26) seems problematic. The concern is not that in principle one cannot find idealist views in ancient philosophy, but what the designation "ancient idealism" could mean given the fact that it was the context of Cartesian subjectivity that gave rise to idealism.

To a certain extent Chapter Two is less ambiguous in this respect. Here Dunham, Grant, and Watson discuss in greater detail why and how idealism became the dominating view in early modern philosophy, i.e., in rationalism (Descartes, Malebranche, Leibniz) and empiricism (Berkeley). There are two distinguishing features of early modern idealism. One is that idealism derives from Descartes' mind-body dualism and his Platonist theory of ideas as "innate archetypes common to all rational beings" (p. 35). Hence, the term 'idealism'. Accordingly, ideas are what is in our or God's mind and what gives us access to the external world. By and large this view can be retraced in most early modern kinds of idealism as the authors show with respect to Malebranche, Leibniz and Berkeley. The second feature is that the 'subjectivist' foundation of idealism does not mean that early modern idealists subscribed to a skeptical account of reality across the board. Maybe some of them are anti-realists by implication, but certainly not by intention. This is clear from Descartes's mechanist natural philosophy, Leibniz's  monadology and even Berkeley's esse est percipi. Malebranche might be an exception since he believes that ideas only exist in God's mind and that the external world does not really exist (p. 49). The section on Malebranche is particularly instructive since it not only critically discusses his philosophy of ideas (p. 49-54), but also elucidates his occasionalism as the view that "God is the only true cause" of movement, all other causes only being "occasional" (p. 56).

This clarification is important in regard to Leibniz, whose idealism is contrasted with Malebranche's. While Malebranche conceives of the world in terms of occasionalism, Leibniz conceives of it in terms of prefectionism since it is created by God (p. 60). The fundament of Leibniz's idealism, characterized as "Platonic idealism" (p. 66), is the monadology. Although Dunham, Grant, and Watson do not profile Leibnizean idealism in great detail, they give a fine overview of his theory, arguing that Leibniz is a phenomenalist (pp. 69-72). The way they succeed in assessing the secondary literature on the question of whether Leibniz is an idealist or a realist is exemplary. The common feature that can be established between Malebranche and Leibniz also pertains to Berkeley: God as the source of ideas had by finite rational beings. In the section on Berkeley the authors give a very clear outline of the crucial elements of his empiricism, in particular of his critique of primary and secondary qualities and the argument for God as the true preserver of reality, from which they conclude that Berkeley is an idealist (pp. 82-85). However, it doesn't seem convincing to dub Berkeleyean idealist immaterialism as "Neoplatonic", "pantheistic and panpsychic" (p. 85), while at the same time emphasizing that Berkeley's idealism "is quite different" from the idealisms of Plato and Plotinus when it comes to abstract universals (p. 79).

In the history of idealism Kant is obviously the first philosopher who calls himself an idealist. Given the prevalent condemnation of idealism in eighteenth-century philosophy this is rather surprising.[3] On the one hand, the theory Kant puts forward is not idealism simpliciter but transcendental idealism, according to which what we represent are appearances and not things in themselves (CPR B 518-519). Contrary to this standard definition, the authors create the impression that Kant's idealism is to be understood on the basis of his doctrine of the transcendental ideas of the Dialectic (p. 89). This is certainly not the case. The point of departure for Kantian idealism is the critical theory of space and time as forms of intuition leading to transcendental idealism and empirical realism. The brief discussion of transcendental idealism does not do justice to Kant's theory. The authors maintain that, according to Kant, experiences are "somehow" experiences of the "noumenon" or "transcendental object" (p. 93). This interpretation is irritating as the noumenon cannot be an object of possible experience for Kant (CPR B 294-303). The discussion of transcendental idealism is not convincing since the authors once again do not characterize the kind of idealism Kant argues for, i.e., they specifically do not engage in the discussion of whether Kant is a one-worlder or a two-worlder, etc. Moreover, they do not consider Kant's celebrated and far reaching controversy with Feder and Garve, who depicted transcendental idealism as full-fledged Berkeleyean idealism. A final problem is that the authors carry idealism into Kant's practical philosophy (pp. 99-105), although Kant explicitly denies that transcendental philosophy is concerned with morals (CPR B 29).

Kant is an idealist. He is not, however, a German idealist. For Kant claims that possible experience defines the critical limits of cognition, a claim to which the German idealists do not subscribe. The problem with German idealism is that it must be conceived of as a highly complex and heterogeneous philosophical movement that does not allow for a homogeneous understanding of its idealist theories. It is therefore a challenge to provide an overview of German idealisms. As to Fichte, the authors depict his transcendental idealism as "foundationalism" which "finds its grounding principles in the acts of intelligence" (p. 121). It is an idealism that insists on the "primacy of practice" (p. 117), and in this respect reveals similarities to Levinas's ethics as first philosophy (p. 128). Although the authors do not engage in the development and hence the changes of Fichte's position throughout his career, they present a useful overview, especially of his early Doctrine of Science. This is true also of the section on Schelling's idealism which explicitly considers his rich intellectual evolution from his early beginnings to the Weltalter-Fragmente. That "Schelling's work remains largely unknown" (p. 129), as the authors complain, is not true for German, French and Italian scholarship on Schelling.

German idealism culminates in Hegel since Hegel makes the strongest idealist claim: he argues for the all-encompassing rational cognition of the absolute. Here the authors' focus on philosophy of nature (p. 144); as their reference work they chose the Encyclopedia. This seems rather questionable since in this work Hegel only gives an abbreviated account of his philosophy, mainly for students. The authors' discussion of this is not always easy to grasp, e.g., their explication of Hegelian "objective idealism" as the view according to which "concepts are not alien to things" and that the "real determinations of particulars are themselves universal" (p. 144; cf. 156-157). Dunham, Grant, and Watson work their way through Hegel's demanding theory in order to show why idealism and "naturalism" are not incompatible. As such, this approach is reasonable as a way to explain what idealism means to Hegel. However, once more they do not really qualify the kind of idealism Hegel advocates, e.g., by contrasting it with competing idealist theories. At one point only do they give a hint: when "absolute idealism" is opposed to Cartesian dualism and connected with Spinoza's one substance (p. 155-157). From the Phenomenology's claim that substance must become subject, Hegel's "decentred account of subjectivity" (p. 156), as the authors appropriately put it, and idealism should have been developed. This would have allowed the authors to also include the historical or developmental aspect of idealism which, as mentioned earlier, they widely ignore.

One of the book's major merits is that it considers British idealism to be a substantial part of the history of idealism. On the one hand, the British idealists are to be seen in a continuous line with Hegelian idealism; on the other hand, its major representatives -- Green, Bradley, McTaggert and Bosanquet -- champion idealisms of their own. As the authors explain, the two major ideas British idealism centers around are "holism" and "monism", i.e., "the problem about the relation of wholes and their parts" (p. 159). This is shown with respect to Green's view that reality is fundamentally relational, Bradley for whom relations are not real but appearance, McTaggert's theory according to which reality is fundamentally relational rather than being composed of substances, and Bosanquet's "panpsychist idealism" (p. 170) of the "union which the mind has with the whole of nature" (p. 200). This chapter concludes that there is no intrinsic connection between idealism and a subjectivist account of reality (p. 170, cf. 201-209).

Dunham, Grant, and Watson do not believe that the history of idealism came to an end by the late nineteenth century. Though one could argue that Husserl's phenomenology, which the book does not consider, belongs to that history, the authors continue that history with late-twentieth-century science. They take Maturana and Varela's theory of "autopoiesis" to be an example of Kantian and Hegelian idealism in recent philosophy (pp. 224-238). Though one might find similarities, e.g., between their conception of living systems and Kant's idea of the end in itself, it remains unclear how closely this fits an idealist picture. By contrast, McDowell and Brandom, as well as Rescher, Sprigge and Leslie (p. 256) seem to be more authentic representatives of idealism in contemporary philosophy. There is no doubt that in their theories McDowell and Brandom take up Kantian and Hegelian ideas. However, there is a problem since they do not call themselves idealists. Nevertheless, the authors think these thinkers at least come very close to idealism.

They believe the analytic neo-Kantian McDowell is close to idealism since for him there is neither a priority of nature nor of concepts, and therefore he can't be a naturalist. McDowell belongs to the idealist thinking though he does not advocate "absolute mind-dependence of the world". For him, "concepts are formed from our experience, and our experience is shaped by the world" (p. 259). What makes this idealism is the supposedly Hegelian ingredient that there is a "unity" of "thinking and being, or mind and world" (p. 260). The problem with this putative idealism is that McDowell himself comes up with a mixture of Kantian and Hegelian doctrines that make it difficult to identify which kind of idealism he subscribes to, if he does at all, for Kantian and Hegelian idealism look quite different. The same can be said with respect to Brandom, who likewise is supposed to be an idealist since he believes the world to be inseparable from thought, though for different reasons than McDowell (p. 267). Whereas McDowell's mind-world-unity has primarily epistemological reasons, this unity rests on linguistically based social practice in Brandom (p. 266-267). What makes this idealism is difficult to determine, since once again the authors do not employ any elaborate conception of the specific kind of idealism this is or is not.

This does not mean that what they say about McDowell and Brandom is unintelligible, but that one shouldn't take them to be idealists just because of their frequent allusions to Kant or Hegel. By contrast to this rather blurry appreciation of idealism, the idealist main feature is much clearer in Sprigge whose "panpsychist" or "absolute idealism" takes physicalism to be only an aspect of reality, reality itself "consisting of innumerable centres of experience" (pp. 276, 278). Corresponding to this idealism in analytic philosophy, the authors find idealism also in postmodern philosophy. The thesis that we should conceive of, say, Deleuze as a "philosophical idealist" because he develops "the ontological primacy of the Idea" (p. 284) remains rather unconvincing unless we take 'idealism' to be a more or less arbitrary philosophical view. This, however, is what the authors want to prevent us from doing.

In sum, Dunham, Grant, and Watson give a very helpful survey of the history of philosophical idealism. Many philosophers like Schopenhauer and Santayana that one would have expected to be considered are left out; however, others that are at times disregarded as idealists have been insightfully included. Although the book's shortcoming is that it neither systematizes nor classifies the many versions of idealism in order to help the reader find her way through the jungle of idealist theories, the authors make it clear that idealism cannot just be identified with skepticism, anti-realism, anti-naturalism etc., or the simplified view that nature is spiritual. The final, Hegel-inspired hope the authors express, namely that analytic philosophy might reunify with (German) idealism (p. 297) in the future, probably goes too far, not least since many contemporary philosophers would rather see this as a threat.

[1] Cf., e.g., Dominik Perler: Zweifel und Gewissheit. Skeptische Debatten im Mittelalter. Frankfurt am Main, 2006.

[2] It seems Leibniz was among the first to use the concept "idealism" or "idealist". For instance, in his Réponse aux réflexions (ed. Gerhardt, IV, p. 560) he uses the term "Idealistes". The first systematic classification of "idealism" can be found in Christian Wolff's Deutsche Metaphysik. Accordingly, idealism is not a skeptical but a dogmatic doctrine that claims the existence of only thinking things. It splits into pluralism (more than one thinking substance) and egoism (one thinking substance = solipsism). This systematic classification had a huge impact on eighteenth-century philosophy until Kant. Kant took it up and gave the contemporary discussion important new impulses by specifying kinds of idealism (as well as of realism). One thing is crucial: the concept "idealism" originally had an exclusively epistemological meaning originating in modern Cartesian subjectivity. This is why the use of this term with respect to ancient philosophy seems illegitimate or at least needs further explanation. It was not before the German idealists that philosophers made use of "idealism" in a much broader, e.g., ontological sense.

[3] The so-called "refutation of idealism" was part of almost every treatise in metaphysics of that time, e.g., in the works of Wolff, Baumgarten and Crusius. Since Kant was familiar with these works it is not a surprise that a "Refutation of Idealism" can be found in the first Critique (B 274-279).