Ideas in Process: A Study on the Development of Philosophical Concepts

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Nicholas Rescher, Ideas in Process: A Study on the Development of Philosophical Concepts, Ontos, 2009, 148pp., €59.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380385.

Reviewed by Stephen Hetherington, University of New South Wales



Nicholas Rescher, it could be said, has had several philosophical careers, all at once. He has certainly had enough ideas to sustain a multitude of philosophical careers. The rest of us should shake heads — our own — as we contemplate the number and variety of his books. How many of us have thought about so much philosophy? Very few, I suspect. How many of us have written so much philosophy? Almost no one has, we know.

And so… here is another book by Rescher. Its recognizably Rescherian theme is one to which not enough philosophers pay enough attention. When resting on the porch, watching the evening take shape, home from the day’s labours in the philosophical factory, having there been absorbed in the engrossing technical issues of the month or year, more of us should think more about the point — the philosophical point — of it all. What can philosophy achieve? Are there genuinely deep and recurring philosophical problems, ones we may even try to solve?

That is a philosophically good question, and Rescher is a very good philosopher. Let there be no doubt about that. Nevetheless I also have to say that this is not a very good book. Although its guiding question is excellent, the ensuing discussion is not. I am disappointed to be saying this, because I wanted the discussion to be good. The book’s pivotal question is one that analytic philosophers, especially, are inclined not to ask seriously; yet they should. So the prospect of reading Rescher on this question had me reaching eagerly for the book, really hoping to benefit from his vast philosophical learning and expertise.

Well, after those opening paragraphs, the least I can do is to tell you more about the book’s key question. It is the question of how, if at all, a philosophical idea or concept can survive across the ages. A kind of historicism is Rescher’s stated enemy here — the view that no concept can persist like that. This historicism was R. G. Collingwood’s. It advises us that no philosophical problem exists across the years. Any philosophical idea or issue is from, for, and of a specific time. According to that sort of historicism, we cannot pluck out ‘the philosophical problem of X’ — asking what philosophers from different eras thought about it, wondering who was right and who was wrong in their attendant reflections, while remaining confident all the while that there is such an ‘it’.

A meta-meta-philosophical question now arises: Is that historicism itself a continuing view we are still able to discuss, irrespective of its historical roots? Clearly, Rescher believes so; let us follow him in this. The book begins by describing the historicist challenge (ch. 1). How may we respond to it? Briefly (ch. 2), Rescher offers us four models of conceptual change-or-not. (I will outline them in a moment.) Then — this is the bulk of the book — different chapters aim to provide respective examples of those models. The final chapter (ch. 8) comments upon this process. (No coincidence, that; the book is published in a series, Process Thought.) Rescher’s conclusion is that even if attempts to learn or impart information are historically limited, the content — the information — as such need not be.

The book’s conceptual heart is its articulation of those four models — the identity model, the common core model, the thematic linkage model, and the dialectical model. Earlier, I said “change-or-not” in describing what it is of which these are models. This is because in one sort of case — that covered by the identity model — the concept in question is not changing over time. According to this model, philosopher way-back-when and philosopher here-and-now can be focusing upon the same, the very same, concept. In contrast, each of the other three models portrays some kind of conceptual change. The common core model envelops partial identity, even across many incarnations of the concept: although aspects of the concept vary, part of it never does. The thematic linkage model allows the concept-now1 and the concept-now2 (for any “now1” and “now2”) to share some part without there having to be a single reappearing part. There can be real alterations, but even over time disjointness of content will not be the final result of those alterations. Finally, the dialectical model is like the thematic linkage one, except that in this case disjointness will have been the result over the specified period of time.

All of that sounds potentially intriguing; why is this nonetheless not a good book? The main problem is that the discussion is philosophically too cursory. While almost all of the book — approximately 85% of it — is devoted to illustrating the applicability of the four models, the illustrations do not engage at all deeply with the book’s key question. They function mainly as scant overviews of who-said-what-about-which. Too little effort is made even to show why a particular illustration is an example of this, not that, model.

Here is the layout of those illustrative chapters:

The identity model is illustrated by the concept of free will (ch. 3).

The common core model is illustrated by the concepts of intersubstantival relations (ch. 4) and analyticity (ch. 5).

The thematic linkage model is illustrated by the concept of a coherence theory of truth (ch. 6).

And the dialectical model is illustrated by the concept of dialectic (ch. 7).

All of that looks like we could be reading a good book. The failings are in the details of the illustrations. Successive sections offer only quite truncated and ‘textbook’ expositions of philosopher A on concept B — one after another after. It becomes somewhat monotonous — with, a touch ironically, little sense being conveyed of any real process of conceptual passage from one of these philosophers to the next. I am not saying that I learnt nothing from all of this. Definitely, I did. (For a start, some German philosophers are mentioned of whom, previously, I had known little or nothing.) Nevertheless I am confident that readers will want more accompanying philosophical exploration than Rescher provides. We know he could do it; he simply does not. He is one of not-so-many philosophers with the ability to immerse us quite profitably in such an array. Too often in this book, though, he is skating swiftly across the surface of these people’s writings. Too rarely does he link his expositions clearly to his original question about concept-identity and concept-persistence, through applications of his models. Although there is some guidance, there could have been much more.

For example, the longest chapter — the one on dialectic — is intended to illustrate the dialectical model’s applicability. It shows us how different a concept of dialectic was used by ancient Greek philosophers (among whom, we may notice, its comparatively unified use meant that the dialectical model was not being exemplified) from that which was so important to Marx, Engels, and “post-Marxian socio-political dialectics” (p. 118). With this observation, naturally, we will want to know on what grounds we are confident that it is a single concept — encompassing dialectic-way-back-then and dialectic-more-recently; each a kind of dialectic — that is being discussed in the two instances. Rightly, Rescher tells us that we must look beyond any commonality in uses of a word: shared employment of the word “dialectic” does not entail that there is a shared concept of dialectic (pp. 9-10). Rather, interpretation of those various uses is needed. Yet how is this to be done, especially when the dialectical model in particular is supposedly being instantiated for a single concept (such as that of dialectic)? In such a case, how can we know that just one concept is present — albeit as one that is undergoing change? Precisely because so much change is involved when the dialectical model is the enveloping one, what does constitute the conceptual continuity? Rescher does not engage with this pressing question. Or, for that matter, with so many others of similar ilk. None of the following, for instance, attract his attention.

Are there other possible models, beyond these favoured four? Are all of these four equally used, or at least applicable, within philosophy? Is there any pattern to how they are distributed across the conceptual landscape? Are some of these more likely to shape specific areas of philosophy?

(And now to some evaluative questions.) Do Rescher’s four models possess equal explanatory worth? Are all of them equally coherent? I commented a moment ago on the difficulty of ever knowing the applicability, specifically, of the dialectical model (as an explanation of how a single concept can somehow persist in spite of the strong appearance of not doing so). So, let me ask bluntly whether the concept of the dialectical model is even coherent, as a model of a single concept undergoing change that does not annihilate the concept. Should Rescher have offered only the other three models, setting to one side the dialectical model? For instance, does the description of something as dialectic in an ancient Greek sense cohere — all within the scope of one concept of dialectic — with a description of something as dialectic in a contemporary Marxist sense?

To ask that question, however, is to wonder about an application of the concept of coherence truth; how is it to be understood? Remember that it is one of Rescher’s illustrative examples (ch. 6). Remember, also, his conclusion that it is the thematic linkage model — not the dialectical model — with which we should be modelling the on-going existence of the concept of coherence truth. What if the thematic linkage model, however, is itself incoherent? (Rescher nowhere defends the coherence as such of any of his models.) Would coherence truth then not be understood via a concept with the philosophical lineage we currently associate with it? Would this affect our sense of its philosophical worth?

A related question: Can one model give way to another, even for a single concept? Rescher applied the dialectical model to the concept of dialectic: ancient Greek uses of the concept (he claims) are so different to recent uses of it. Nevertheless, as I noted earlier, the dialectical model seemed not to apply within the various ancient Greek uses (as described by Rescher) of the concept of dialectic — even if he is right about its characterizing the history of that concept when the concept is evaluated in those-centuries-as-compared-to-the-past-century-or-so. A different one of his four models — one other than the dialectical model — would therefore apply to the ancient Greek uses. Consequently (we may wonder), in general how long are we to wait until there is enough evidence as to which model is applying at a time? Or can we only ever say that so far model M1 has been applying — even if later we would decide that, by then, model M2 is the applicable one? In short, what model applies to the concept of conceptual change-if-at-all itself? Questions like those crowd quickly upon us. I wish that Rescher had spent more of his book discussing such conceptual issues about concepts.

I also wish — and this is not a new thought about some of his books — that Rescher had spent more time on proof-reading. This book contains far too many typographical mistakes: for much of the book, seemingly there is more than one per page. I am not talking merely of a letter here, a comma there. It is far more distinctive than that. Would-be sentences give up the attempt to grow into real sentences. Would-be words follow suit. Changeling words also appear frequently, often with philosophically misleading results. All of this is unfortunate because — let me reiterate the point — Rescher is a fine philosopher. Many of us, I am sure, wish to be able to appreciate this about him whenever we read one of his books. But this book is — for philosophically irrelevant reasons — difficult to read. Repeatedly, I had to pause so as to make educated or contextual guesses as to ‘what word was intended to be used here’. Such a book does Rescher no favours. When I remark that this is a pity, I mean it. My frustration reflects, in part, genuine respect for Rescher as a philosopher.