Žižek: A (Very) Critical Introduction

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Marcus Pound, Žižek: A (Very) Critical Introduction, Eerdmans, 2008, 168pp., $19.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802860019.

Reviewed by Alessia Ricciardi, UC Berkeley



Since the end of the 1980s, the American academic world has had to face Slavoj Žižek’s repeated, and at times repetitive, critical assaults on identity politics, multiculturalism, and post-Marxism. Žižek has increasingly advocated in his work a return to the notion of modern subjectivity that was initially spelled out by the German idealists and then recuperated and transfigured by Lacan; together, their contributions comprise the strategic knot of the Slovenian philosopher’s theoretical framework.

His latest salvo against the supposedly widespread liberal assumptions of contemporary culture has taken the form of a revival of religion, particularly of Christianity, in The Fragile Absolute: or why is the christian legacy worth fighting for? (2000), On Belief (2001), and The Puppet and the Dwarf: The Perverse Core of Christianity (2003). In the course of these writings, Žižek has moved from using Christianity as a reservoir of illustrative examples for his philosophical forays to engaging directly with its theological core, ultimately arriving at a position he describes as that of a “Pauline materialist”. As a follower of Saint Paul, Žižek takes pride in grappling with religion in its institutional, dogmatic aspects, unlike, say, Levinas who in his eyes insists on reducing it to empty notions such as “Otherness”.

In line with Hegel’s Christology, Žižek insists that Christianity ought to help bring about an end to the God of transcendence and “the beyond”, thus enabling us, as a Lacanian would say, “to traverse the fantasy” of the Christian desire for the Divine (and the Judaic desire for God) in favor of love. Christianity becomes for Žižek something akin to a successful analysis and finds its defining moment in the Hilflösigkeit or helplessness experienced by the abandoned Christ on the cross. In fact, according to Lacan, this feeling characterizes the end of an effective analysis. Building on this insight, Žižek rejects the reading of Christ’s sacrificial death as perverse and instead emphasizes the redemptive possibilities of Christian faith. What in his view requires further thought is Christianity’s reliance on “violent love”, which nevertheless accords with the spirit of a radical event, namely the crucifixion. Žižek opposes this spirit to the poetics of harmony and compassion espoused by Eastern religions such as Taoism and Buddhism that have become fashionable in Western culture and function as a mere supplement of capitalism.

Žižek’s engagement with Christianity raises a host of questions starting with the meaning of his notion of a religious suspension of the ethical, a concept that, notwithstanding its Kierkegaardian pedigree, can be confusing in his work. The most urgent questions are raised by his insistence on an organic relationship between religion and politics. Unlike the Leftist Hegelians, in particular Feuerbach and Marx, who criticized Christianity from a philosophico-political point of view, Žižek seems to believe that in breaking with the logic of desire for a transcendent divinity, Christianity opposes the logic of capitalism through its insistence on love as opposed to the desire that drives perpetual consumption. Although not entirely new, the use of Christianity in support of a Marxist agenda is certainly controversial, as is Žižek’s adoption of Hegel’s polemic in his Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, which views other religions, in particular Judaism, as less perfect antecedents of Christianity. By helping to preserve spiritual and political conviction from the attacks of both contemporary skeptics and fundamentalists, Christianity becomes pivotal to Žižek’s theory.

Given this background, Marcus Pound’s discussion of Žižek’s work in light of Christianity is an interesting project that helps to highlight the growing importance of questions of faith in orienting Žižek’s thought toward a “materialist theology”. Pound addresses some of the enigmas and paradoxes that Žižek’s interpretation of Christian doctrine poses and is most effective when pointing out the link between Christianity and the political aspects of Žižek’s thought: “This book assumes the position that only by ceding the priority of secular liberalism, making instead the theological turn, can we rediscover the Left’s political edge.” Although at times he overstates his point, Pound is also right to emphasize the importance of the Christian thematic in Lacan’s work, helpfully decoding the religious genealogy of the Lacanian category of “the Name of the Father” that organizes the symbolic order, investigating the definition of God as “unconscious” in Seminar XI, and spelling out the religious references to Saint Thomas in his late concept of the “synthome”. In so doing, Pound allows us to understand much better the relationship in Žižek’s work between the Lacanian psychoanalytic framework and his “materialist theology”.

At its more speculative moments, however, Pound’s book might be said to play the critical role of a complex financial instrument such as a “derivative-default swap” insofar as it presents us with theoretical equations that exponentially multiply the difficulties normally met by readers of the Slovenian philosopher. Pound evidently does not choose to “urbanize” Žižek’s work as Gadamer supposedly did with Heidegger’s philosophy; he leaves us instead with a provocative but often confusing set of interpretations. Rather than systematically explaining the theoretical and genealogical context relevant to Žižek’s turn to religion, Pound mobilizes citations from Žižek, Lacan, John Millbank, Matthew Sharpe, Conor Cunningham, and even bits of popular culture in an attempt to illustrate the theological significance of Žižek’s position on specific topics from the question of the radical political act to sexual difference.

In other words, Pound has absorbed all too well Žižek’s pedagogy of de-contextualization and “perverse” fragmentation. In this sense, the goal that Pound defines in the book’s introduction of “providing a general and intelligible introduction to the work of Žižek” is not really achieved, as Pound’s approach is too eclectic to yield a coherent hermeneutics of Žižek’s work. The author claims in the introduction that Žižek’s work vis-à-vis Lacan represents mimetic exegesis more than clarifying critical engagement: “The scandal of Žižek’s work is his failure to adopt the position of the objective rational critic, maintaining instead an uncritical fidelity to Lacan’s framework of discussion.” For the most part, unfortunately, we can say as much about Pound’s own position vis-à-vis Žižek.

Notwithstanding its author’s basic “exegetical method”, Žižek: A (Very) Critical Introduction does manage in passing to provide critical and even “very critical” engagements with Žižek’s positions. In the first chapter, Pound critiques Žižek’s interpretation of violence as the horizon of the political and, in the second chapter, questions Žižek’s nihilistic ontology. Pound proceeds to expose the disappearance of the material body from Žižek’s theory in favor of linguistic idealism in the fourth chapter. This particular essay is in fact quite daring in its exploration of how the formulae of sexuation in Lacan’s Seminar XX might apply to Aquinas and at its most insightful moments succeeds in making more intelligible Lacan’s notoriously difficult logic of femininity. Throughout the book, Pound productively interrogates Žižek’s reading of Christianity in terms of the logic of abandonment. The “afterword” or coda of Pound’s study of Žižek, “The Counterbook of Christianity”, features the philosopher’s own replies to the author’s queries. These responses soon turn into an amusing reading of Christianity through an analysis of the narrative and counternarrative structure of Hitchcock’s masterpieces Vertigo and Psycho. Perhaps unsurprisingly, Žižek concludes that Christianity functions as a “negation of negation”, a counterbook to the book, in which the antithesis (Christ’s death) represents “synthesis itself at its purest”. In his eyes, this is a truth that is valid not only for Christianity but also for Hegelian dialectic as such. The book’s postscript thus provides a snippet of the philosopher in viva voce that sharply draws attention to the quirkiness of Žižek’s methodological approach and frequently dazzling and humorous insights. It is a style so personal and idiosyncratic that Pound would have been best advised not to try to emulate it.