Ignorance: On the Wider Implications of Deficient Knowledge

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Nicholas Rescher, Ignorance: On the Wider Implications of Deficient Knowledge, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2009, 170pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822960140.

Reviewed by René van Woudenberg, VU University Amsterdam


Nobody knows the day on which the last Neanderthals died nor does anybody know what Caesar had for breakfast on the Ides of March. We are ignorant about these matters. Still, it is possible that the information required for knowing these matters becomes available in the future. Knowledge here isn't inherently impossible. Let ignorance that in principle (though perhaps not as a matter of fact) can be dispelled, be called contingent ignorance. Nicholas Rescher's loosely composed[1] recent book (I daren't say most recent book, for by the time this review appears another Rescher volume may have seen the light of day) is not on contingent ignorance. It is, at least in the main, on necessary ignorance, i.e. on ignorance of truths that, as a matter of principle, cannot possibly be dispelled -- not even by tons of new information.[2]

In this review I will focus primarily on Rescher's arguments for the existence of necessary ignorance -- but along the way will also address other elements of his book.

Rescher offers the following argument for the existence of necessary or, as he also seems to call it, inevitable ignorance[3]: "[I]f F1 is a fact that X1 does not know, and F2 a fact that X2 doesn't know, then there will be a fact, namely F1-and-F2, which neither X1 nor X2 knows. And this cognitive route to unknown facts will extend across the entire landscape of existing individuals." (p. 5) Spelled out, I suppose, the argument is the following:

P1: F1 is a fact that X1doesn't know

P2: F2 is a fact that X2 doesn't know

P3: F3 is a fact that X3 doesn't know

Pn-1: Fn-1 is a fact that Xn-1 doesn't know

Pn: Fn is a fact that Xn doesn't know

Therefore, there is a fact, namely F1&F2&F3&Fn-1&Fn, that nobody knows.

This argument supposes that if F1 is a fact, and F2 is a fact too, then there is a further fact that is composed of F1 and F2. But this is in no way an innocent assumption. It is far from obvious that if my car's being blue and your dad's being in his eighties are facts then there is some further fact of which these facts are parts.[4]

Offering an argument for the existence of necessary ignorance, of course, isn't offering examples of necessary ignorance. And there would even seem to be a problem in providing examples. The problem can be brought out by comparing two first-person utterances: (1) "I know that p is a truth that I am ignorant of" and (2) "I know there is a truth I am ignorant of". (1) is self-contradictory, (2) is not. It is self-contradictory to specify a truth and go on to say that one is ignorant of that truth. It is not self-contradictory, however, to assert without specification that there is a truth one is ignorant of. Rescher notes the difference between (1) and (2) (pp. 7-8), but it isn't entirely clear what moral he wants the draw from it. On the one hand he seems to suggest that it marks a distinction between specific and indefinite ignorance (p. 7), on the other hand that one's knowledge of one's ignorance can only be indefinite, never specific, and hence that there is no specific ignorance. (p. 8)

But can't our ignorance be, in some sense, specific? Can't I say without self-contradiction that there are specific things I am ignorant of? Can't I coherently say that I am ignorant of the specific proposition that Betty has a Buick (in case I don't know that proposition's truth value)? In order to discuss this question we should take note of two ways in which ignorance can be characterized. So far I have used one characterization, viz. ignorance as the failure to know truths. Rescher calls this propositional ignorance (p. 29), but it is more adequate to say that what we have here is a propositional characterization of ignorance. On a second characterization ignorance is the inability to answer questions. Rescher calls this erotetic ('question-oriented') ignorance (p. 29), but again it is more adequate to say that what we have here is an erotetic characterization of ignorance. According to Rescher, an erotetic characterization of ignorance has a certain advantage over a propositional characterization: it enables one to specify one's ignorance. As noted, we cannot say without self-contradiction (1) "I know that p is a truth that I am ignorant of", but we can say, without self-contradiction, (3) "I know there is a specific question Q that I cannot answer". So, one can't, says Rescher, specify one's ignorance when ignorance is characterized propositionally, but one can specify one's ignorance when it is characterized erotetically. But this is puzzling, because contrary to what Rescher seemed to suggest earlier on, this means that ignorance can, after all, be specific.[5] And not only can ignorance be specific when it is characterized erotetically, but also when it is characterized propositionally. For I can say (and know) that I am ignorant as to whether Jack has a Buick.

As was just indicated, one of Rescher's characterizations of ignorance is in terms of questions: ignorance is the inability to answer questions. But this can't be correct as it stands. For there are many cases in which an agent's inability to answer a question doesn't qualify as ignorance. If you ask me a question that I am unable to answer because my tongue is paralyzed, or because I am struck dumb by your overwhelming presence, or because moral scruples prevent me from doing so, then none of this is sufficient to qualify me as an ignoramus. Inability to answer questions is ignorance only if the inability is of a certain kind. Rescher doesn't specify that kind. But as a first approximation we may perhaps say that the inability must be of an intellectual kind.

Let us now turn to some of Rescher's examples of necessary ignorance. One has to do with the introduction of public safety measures, such as an inoculation campaign, or the setting of a certain speed limit, or the instalment of a certain traffic light. "There is no question", Rescher maintains, that through these measures

many lives are saved. But whose? Many among us would not be here if these steps had not been taken. Yet who are they? We know there are some who were saved by the measures but there is no way of telling who they are: this is something nobody knows or indeed can known. There are bound to be individuals of whom it is true that their life was so saved, and consequently there is a fact of the matter here: "X's life was saved" will be, and will have to be, true for certain values of X, for certain individuals. But there is no way for us ever to identify such an individual. (p. 9)

I am not convinced, however, that this is a case of necessary ignorance (a case of something that is inherently unknowable), as opposed to a case of contingent ignorance. In order to know that Sam's life was saved by the placement of a certain traffic light, one needs to have knowledge of counterfactual conditionals, such as the following, that involve both Sam and the traffic light.

(a) Had that traffic light not been in place, Sam would have been hit by a truck

(b) Had there been no traffic light, Sam would have taken the same route as he in fact did.

Knowledge of such counterfactuals may, in practice, be very hard for us to come by. But some such counterfactuals may in fact be known by us. They don't seem to be inherently unknowable. An all-knowing agent could and would know these counterfactuals. I therefore contend that if this is an example of ignorance, it is an example of contingent ignorance.

Another example of necessary ignorance that Rescher offers has to do with coin tossing. As we know, a coin will come up heads or tails, but we have no idea which it will be. So we are inevitably and necessarily ignorant of the outcome of the toss. (pp. 9-10) I doubt, again, whether this is correct. Laplace's supermind knows all the forces that operate on the coin were it to be tossed, and therefore knows the outcome in advance. So even if we are ignorant of the outcome, the ignorance isn't necessary -- it is contingent as it depends on the limitations of our cognitive capacities.

Both of these putative examples of necessary ignorance give reason to introduce a distinction that Rescher seems to have overlooked. We may think of necessary ignorance in a relativized as well as a non-relativized way. In a non-relativized way, necessary ignorance means 'intrinsically unknowable', but in a relativized way it means 'unknowable for agents of a certain sort' or 'unknowable given certain cognitive capacities'. So we can distinguish three types of ignorance:

·     Contingent ignorance (or C-ignorance): ignorance that could, in principle, be overcome; it is ignorance that is due, for instance, (i) to laziness, or (ii) to the fact that by sheer happenstance one has never come across certain evidences, or (iii) to lack of time to figure out something.

·     Relativized/necessary ignorance (or R/n-ignorance): ignorance due to the limits of human cognitive capacities; this is ignorance due to a thing's being unknowable for beings like ourselves.

·     Necessary ignorance (or N-ignorance): ignorance due to a thing's being inherently unknowable.[6]

As to the relation between R/n- and N-ignorance: N-ignorance entails R/n-ignorance, but the reverse doesn't hold. To return to the two examples discussed so far: if they are cases of necessary ignorance, they are cases R/n-ignorance, cases of ignorance due to the limits of human cognitive capacities. They aren't cases of N-ignorance.

Although, then, the examples discussed are not examples of N-ignorance, Rescher seems to offer various arguments for the conclusion that some ignorance is N-ignorance. One argument proceeds from the plausible Principle of Question Propagation that says that "the answering of our factual (scientific) questions always paves the way to further as yet unanswered questions." (p. 31) Suppose now that every answered question gives rise to many new questions at least one of which isn't yet answered; it then follows from the Principle that when inquiry advances and ever more questions get answered, the number of yet-unanswered (asked) questions will grow too. Hence our ignorance (erotetically characterized) will expand as inquiry progresses. So ignorance is unavoidable -- it is necessary. But we should be careful. For even though it is necessary that we are ignorant, this doesn't establish there is necessary ignorance; it doesn't establish that there are truths that nobody can possibly know, or that there are questions that no one can possibly answer. All that follows is that as inquiry progresses there will always be as-yet unanswered questions. But as-yet unanswered questions needn't be unanswerable questions, questions that no one can possibly answer. So this argument doesn't establish the existence of necessary ignorance, neither R/n-ignorance nor N-ignorance.

But Rescher has yet another argument for N-ignorance, a convincing one this time -- one that involves so-called 'vagrant predicates'. Such predicates apply to objects but are such that they cannot be known to apply. The reason for this can be paradoxically stated thus: the moment they are known to apply, they stop being applicable. Here are some examples:

a) … is an idea that never occurs to anybody

b) … is an event that no one ever mentions

c) … is an integer that is never individually specified

d) … is an ever un-stated theory

e) … is a never-mentioned truth

f) … is someone whom everybody has forgotten.

There must be an idea to which predicate a) applies, that is, there must be an idea that never occurs to anybody. But we don't know, and can't possibly know, what that idea is. For, so to speak, the moment we know which idea it is, the idea stops being an idea to which predicate a) applies, for when we know what the idea is, the idea occurs to us. So here our ignorance is, finally, necessary -- we are necessarily ignorant of that to which this vagrant predicate applies. Rescher holds that all the predicates on the list (they can all be found on pp. 32-5) are vagrant, and hence such that we cannot know to what they apply. But that cannot be right. For what holds for a), for example, doesn't hold for b). I know that a certain event took place at time t1 of which I was the only human witness: while hiking in the Yukon at t1, I saw a hare jumping in the water. I never mentioned this event to anybody -- at least not until a moment ago, a moment that I shall refer to as t3. It is clear that at t2, which is a moment prior to t3 but posterior to t1, I knew of a specific event (a hare jumping in the water at t1) that no one had ever mentioned. Surely, "… is an event that so far no one had ever mentioned" (=b*) is not "… is an event that no one ever mentions" (=b). But the event in question could easily be such that b) applies to it. For there is a possible world in which what I saw in the Yukon is the same as what I saw in the actual world (viz. a hare jumping in the water), but in which I hadn't mentioned that event for purposes of example to anyone and kept silent about it my entire life. In that world I would know of a specific event of which it is true that no one ever mentions it. In that world I would not be ignorant of a specific event to which b) applies. An analogous point can, of course, be made about e), "… is a never mentioned truth". So, there are items to which predicates b) and e) apply, and to which we furthermore know that they apply. And so, contrary to what Rescher implies, we are not necessarily ignorant of specific items to which b) and e) apply. My conclusion is that predicates b) and e) aren't really vagrant.[7] (I am not suggesting there are no vagrant predicates.)

Rescher offers a further argument for the existence of necessary ignorance, one involving what he calls, referring to the Old Testament prophet, Isaiah's Principle. This principle, which he claims is a 'fundamental law of epistemology', is that "a mind of lesser power is for this very reason unable to understand the workings of a mind of greater power." (p. 64) A weaker mind, Rescher says, can of course acknowledge that a stronger mind can solve problems that she can't. But she can't understand how the stronger mind is able to do so. A mind that can barely master tic-tac-toe can't possibly comprehend the ways of a chess expert. A mathematical tyro can't understand a mathematical prodigy like Ramanujan. Now Rescher's argument for the existence of necessary ignorance is this:

(1) Physical reality is reflective of the work of a mind more powerful than ours (p. 66)

(2) A mind of lesser power is unable to understand the workings of a mind of greater power (=Isaiah's Principle)

(3) Therefore, an adequate apprehension of nature is beyond our grasp. (p. 66)

Since Rescher offers nothing by way of argument for (1), all that can be claimed for (3) is that it follows provided one accepts (1). Apart from this there is a problem with the argument in that some kind of equivocation is going on. The first premise involves the notion 'the work of a mind more powerful than ours', the second premise the notion 'the workings of a mind of a greater power'. But 'work of a mind' and 'workings of a mind' aren't the same; the first notion denotes a certain result of mind activity, the second one mind activity itself. If we de-equivocate the argument, we get two arguments. When the notion of 'work' is used throughout, however, the second premise, Isaiah's Principle, is no longer true. For a mind of lesser power may be able to understand a (relatively) simple work, say a written inscription in the sand, of a mind of greater power. Will the argument be sound when the notion of 'workings' is used throughout? Only if we can make sense of the new rendition of the first premise. And I, for one, can't.

Another area of necessary, or as Rescher says unavoidable, ignorance has to do with what lies in the future. Many obstacles prevent us from having 'predictive foreknowledge', which is the topic of the longest chapter of the book, chapter 6. It is somewhat unfortunate that Rescher doesn't explain what the contrast of predictive foreknowledge is supposed to be. Is it non-predictive foreknowledge? And what is the nature of such non-predictive foreknowledge supposed to be? Is it knowledge that, say, at some future time a certain specific event will happen, where this foreknowledge has not the nature of a prediction? But then: what is a prediction? It is a statement of the proposition that at some future time something will happen, or something will be the case. But if this is a prediction, then all foreknowledge is predictive in nature and hence 'non-predictive foreknowledge' is an oxymoron. I therefore tentatively conclude that 'predictive foreknowledge' is a pleonasm -- it doesn't single out a subsector of foreknowledge; it covers the entire sector.[8]

As Rescher convincingly argues, there are many obstacles to the possession of foreknowledge -- many impediments to the acquisition of true predictive propositions. Some are ontological, others epistemological in nature. Ontological obstacles exist insofar as the future is developmentally open -- i.e. causally undetermined or underdetermined by the existing realities of the present and open to the development of wholly new unprecedented patterns owing to the contingencies of choice, chance, and chaos. Epistemological obstacles exist insofar as the future is cognitively inaccessible -- either because we cannot secure the data, or because it is impossible for us to discover the operative laws, or even possibly because the requisite calculations outrun the reach of our capacities.

Rescher specifies seven obstacles to foreknowledge and I propose to look at some of them in some detail. My focus, as before, will be on necessary ignorance. Says Rescher: "The situation where there just are no laws -- rather than there being mere ignorance about them -- is clearly fatal for prediction." (p. 102) But is this true? Is it correct to say that in situations where there are no laws, ignorance about the future is necessary? For theists at least there is reason for doubt. For God may have knowledge of the future free actions of humans even if there are no laws that connect their past and present states with future actions. What is needed for that is that God has knowledge of what Alvin Plantinga has called 'counterfactuals of creaturely freedom'. If this is correct, then God isn't necessarily ignorant in a situation where there just are no laws. But even apart from this there may be reason for doubt. There is no law that connects my son's past and present behaviour to what he will do tomorrow. Still, I may truly predict, and hence foreknow, on the basis of a couple of counterfactuals of freedom (specified to him) in conjunction with knowledge of their antecedents, what he will do tomorrow. If I am ignorant of my son's behaviour tomorrow, I am not necessarily N-ignorant of it.

Even if there are laws, there may be obstacles for foreknowledge, says Rescher. For there may be situations in which laws don't permit a secure inference of particular conclusions but leave outcomes undetermined due to chance. Hence chance is an obstacle to foreknowledge. My question is again this: is, in a situation like this, ignorance N- or only R/n-ignorance? The answer all depends on what we take chance to be. The context of the discussion indicates that Rescher is thinking here of 'chance' as an ontological phenomenon. An event in a system is 'chancy' if it is not determined by the laws of nature and the initial state of the system. Some theorists speak of deep chance here. The question is whether deep chance is an obstacle to foreknowledge, whether deep chance is fatal for prediction. Theists, again, may have reason for doubt. For it could be thought that just as there are true counterfactuals of freedom, there are what Del Ratzsch has called true counterfactuals of chance[9] -- counterfactuals that God may know. If such counterfactuals exist, then deep chance doesn't lead to necessary ignorance on God's part. Since to us the counterfactuals of chance are inaccessible, we are ignorant wherever there is deep chance. Our ignorance then is R/n-ignorance; it isn't mere contingent ignorance.

The epistemological obstacles to foreknowledge that Rescher lists are clearly obstacles that hold for beings like us. So, the reality of such obstacles cannot be used in an argument for N-ignorance -- at best for R/n-ignorance. The epistemological obstacles that Rescher lists are real enough: (1) ignorance of laws, (2) ignorance of data and (3) incapability to carry out the needed reasoning even when we are neither ignorant of laws, nor of data. But none of these obstacles make for N-ignorance.

The penultimate chapter (chapter 7) discusses the question "Are there any significant cognitive questions that computers cannot answer?" Rescher answers it in the affirmative by providing an example of just such a question: "When next you [you computer!] answer a question, will the answer be negative?" When the computer says "Yes", the computer says that the next answer will be "No" -- an answer that is contradicted by its actual "Yes". But when the computer answers "No", the computer says that the next answer will be "Yes" -- an answer that is contradicted by its actual "No". And hence the computer is unable to answer the initial question.

At the very end of his book Rescher suggests a very short argument for the conclusion that "ignorance betokens realism" (p. 150), where 'realism' is the thesis that mind-independent things exist. The argument he presents, however, is question-begging. Still, there might be an argument that saves Rescher's intuition and at the same time begs no question against the antirealist, viz. the following IBE:

(1) There are many facts about real things that we are ignorant of. <ass.>

(2) That there are many facts about real things that we are ignorant of is best explained by assuming that real things are mind-independent.

(C) Therefore, real things are mind-independent.

The crucial premise here is, of course, the second one. A proper discussion of it would blow the bounds of this review. But I am inclined to think it is eminently defensible.[10]

[1] The chapters of the book stand more or less on their own and they don't constitute 'one long argument'; they do not cross refer to each other. The book even contains repetitions without the author drawing attention to that fact. An example is the (in itself highly interesting) discussion of Pythia, an all-purpose prediction machine, introduced in chapter 6 (more precisely, pp. 94-100), that is repeated without any substantive new points being made in chapter 7 (more precisely, pp. 132-8). Another example of the book's loose composition is this: on pp. 32-6 so-called 'vagrant predicates' are discussed; on p. 134 an argument is launched that involves such a predicate, but the reader isn't referred back to the earlier discussion. Another example: the book's title speaks of 'deficient knowledge', but there is no real discussion of that notion.

[2] That the book is on necessary ignorance can be distilled from a passage like the following: "The issue of contingent ignorance -- of what people are too lazy or too incompetent to find out about -- does not hold much interest for cognitive theory. What matters from the theoretical point of view are those aspects of ignorance that betoken inherent limits to human knowledge." (p. 3)

[3] One drawback of Rescher's book is that the relationships between various terms and expressions are not made explicit. A case in point is 'necessary ignorance', 'inevitable ignorance' and 'unavoidable ignorance'. I assume these expressions are semantically equivalent, although Rescher nowhere explicitly says so.

[4] One might think that Rescher might make, for repair, the following move. He might propose to substitute 'proposition' for 'fact' in the argument and claim that the problem I raise for the argument in terms of facts doesn't arise for the argument when stated in terms of propositions. For if p and q are propositions, there is a further proposition r of which p and q are the parts (conjuncts). However, there would seem to be problems also for the idea that propositions have parts; conjuncts in a conjunction aren't parts of the conjunction.

[5] There is, perhaps, some room in Rescher's text to avoid this conclusion, for the following reason. Whereas Rescher earlier uses the specific/general distinction (pp. 5-7), later on he works with the concrete/generic distinction (p. 28). However, these distinctions seem to be made to do the same work. I therefore take there to be only one distinction.

[6] On p. 40 it would seem that Rescher is groping for this threefold distinction. This threefold distinction can also be put as follows. Subject S is C-ignorant of p provided S is ignorant of p in some but not in all possible worlds in which S exists; subject S is R/n-ignorant of p provided S is ignorant of p in all possible worlds in which S exists due to certain limitations in S's capacities; subjects are N-ignorant of p provided p is inherently unknowable (i.e. provided there is no possible world in which a subject exists who knows p).

[7] This line of reasoning also holds for d), "… is an ever un-stated theory", if by 'un-stated' is meant 'un-mentioned'. It does not hold if by 'un-stated' is meant 'un-thought'.

[8] But perhaps there is a way to think of predictive foreknowledge as a subsector of foreknowledge. One could think that predictive foreknowledge is foreknowledge that is based on predictions that are based on knowledge of past and present facts in combination with knowledge of the laws of nature. Non-predictive foreknowledge, by contrast, would then be foreknowledge that is not so based. The difference would then be between inferential and non-inferential foreknowledge. Examples of the latter would, perhaps, be clairvoyance, and the sort of foreknowledge that God is supposed to have. If this is how Rescher wishes the phrase 'predictive foreknowledge' to be understood, then he surely hasn't made that explicit.

[9] Del Ratzsch, Nature, design, and Science: The Status of Design in Natural Science. NY: SUNY, 2001.

[10] For comments and discussion I should like to thank Martijn Blaauw, Anthony Booth, Rik Peels and Giedre Vasiliauskaite.