Illusion of Consent: Engaging Carole Pateman

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Daniel I. O'Neill, Mary Lyndon Shanley, and Iris Marion Young (eds.), Illusion of Consent: Engaging Carole Pateman, Penn State UP, 2008, 256pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033518.

Reviewed by Tina Chanter, DePaul University



As Carole Pateman notes in her afterword, included in this volume of essays inspired by her work, we have witnessed, of late, suspensions that go to the very heart of democracy, such as the disregard of the rule of law and the curtailment of civic freedoms hitherto taken to be a basic and defining part of participatory democracies. In the wake of the declaration of a war on terror — an appellation that is all too often wielded in order to justify the concentration of executive powers that has been effected in both the USA and the UK — the urgency of the questions raised by Pateman’s work is all the more pressing.

At stake in Pateman’s distinction between participatory and deliberative democracy is precisely her insight that an intervention must be situated not just at the level of examining how well-reasoned are the processes of deliberative reasoning that constitute democracy; we must also intervene in the pre-existing structures of power that are usually taken for granted by theorists of deliberative democracy. Thus, to question how governments can lie to their citizens about questions as fundamental as taking their nations to war, or about the basic economic realities that define the state of the nation, is not just to question how well-reasoned political arguments are, nor merely to question the adequacy of the evidence adduced for them. It is also a matter of how willing the citizenry is to trust its government, how implicit its faith is in the economic system that has come to be seen as almost inherent to democracy, and how far the hegemonic constraints of a given system dictate the plausibility of the claims a government makes.

The ease with which a government can lie to its people, or rather the depths of the naivety of a citizenry that has become so acquiescent and uninformed that it fails to recognize deception for what it is, exacerbates the stakes of questions that are and should be fundamental to determining the meaning and efficacy of democracy, such as, what is the meaning of freedom, and how can the freedoms of citizens be protected, or rendered meaningful? Such questions are in danger of being eclipsed, especially when the brokering of democratic freedoms must constantly contend with and negotiate the exigencies of corporate aspirations, which so often override every other consideration. These latter, together with an apparently unshakable belief not merely in the sanctity of capitalism, but in the unassailability of the most powerful corporations, which are taken to be too big to fail, are responsible for rendering arguments in favor of a universal basic income or universal employment inadmissible. Even when capitalism manifestly fails, its basic tenets have apparently become so firmly entrenched in everyday consciousness that they trump fundamental questions about the possibility of truly democratic societies existing in a world where “the richest 10 percent monopolize 54 percent of global income” (242).

Jean-Jacques Rousseau’s famous dictum that “Man is free, but everywhere in chains” proves to be true in more ways than one for the debates at the center of this volume. There is a sense in which in order for true freedom to be realized in contract theory, certain limitations of individual freedoms must be agreed upon. It is also the case — according to Pateman and her fellow travelers — that the term “man” must be understood in its literal, gender-specific sense. Social contract theory presupposes not some generic human being, but only those persons in whom is invested the capacity to bear the right of property in their own persons. As such, and contrary to John Locke’s assumption that the notion of the individual operated neutrally, those individuals designated by classical social contract theory tended to be those not marked by gender and race. That is, they tended to inhabit a space presumed to be universal and neutral, but which in fact operated in gender, race, and classed biased ways. They tended to be those who constituted the traditional classes of the landed gentry, namely the propertied classes: wealthy, white, male landholders. In order to lay claim to the rights invested in them by the social contract, runs the argument elaborated by Pateman and expanded by Charles Mills (who also contributes an essay to this volume), this class of landed gentlemen depended upon the subordination of wives, servants, or slaves within the private sphere. Thus there was a structural subordination built into the discrimination between some humans, assumed to be worthy of having the right to own property invested in their persons, and other persons, assumed to be incapable of bearing such rights. The rights of some, then, in the sphere of civil society, have as their corollary the deprivation of the rights of others in the private sphere. Universal rights, it turns out, is a sham.

As for the lower classes — and here is where debates concerning the difference between slaves and wage laborers, or whether rights are inherently alienable or inalienable kick in — while a wage-laborer might be temporarily stripped of his freedom, in the sense of suffering the alienation of his freedom as a function of his employment, in his turn, he nonetheless exercises an absolute right over his wife in the private sphere (or, in Mills’ extrapolation of Pateman, over those he enslaves). Whether or how far it is possible to distinguish between slaves and between those who “agree” to alienate their freedom temporarily under employment contracts as wage laborers, and whether or not all rights should not in fact be inalienable are questions that various contributors address in this volume. The underlying issue here is that the subordination of particular classes or groups of people (the poor, women, slaves) is structurally built into the social contract. This structural subordination is what Pateman’s work has been so important in uncovering and rendering visible, so that it has become a theme for interrogation and available for reworking.

Following up certain insights of Thomas Hobbes, Carole Pateman contests any idea that social contract theory hypothesizes a state of nature imagined to consist of equals, suggesting that in fact any such state, projected back from a time in which social contracts are drawn up, must be viewed as already striated by hierarchies of gender. Building on and amplifying Pateman’s claim in The Sexual Contract (1988), Charles Mills postulates in The Racial Contract (1997) that such a state must also be permeated with racial hierarchies. In one formulation of his social contract theory — and this is a point that Mills makes — Rousseau had already suggested that whatever state might have preceded the social contract, it must have been saturated with class hierarchy.

Several of the contributions in this volume take up, in one way or another, Rousseau’s acknowledgment, in the Discourse on Inequality, that what social contract theory accomplishes is, in effect, the transposition of the privileges of wealth into a right. What were hitherto contingently defined social circumstances are enshrined into the permanence of law and thereby legitimated. John Medearis’ and Michael Goodhart’s essays, by focusing on the issues surrounding poverty, welfare, and the need for democratic societies to ensure a universal basic income, take up in this way the structural inequalities of wealth built into the conditions of the emergence of Rousseau’s social contract.

Some of the defining questions that pervade this volume (devoted to the impact of Pateman’s work on political theory) circle around the various ways in which paradoxes are sustained by political systems and the senses in which Pateman and her co-conspirators draw out or identify as paradoxical the tensions embedded in social and political systems. Some of the authors also offer theoretical resolutions and political solutions to these paradoxes. While Moira Gatens’ contribution stages Pateman’s interventions into contract theory most explicitly and thematically by theorizing them in terms of her ability to point to the paradoxical premises underlying contract theory, the concept of paradoxes, inconsistencies or incompatibilities also informs, to a greater or lesser degree, the concerns of several other contributors. Perhaps the definitive paradox or incompatibility to which Pateman’s work has drawn attention is that, as Goodhart puts it, “subordination and democratic citizenship are incompatible” (139). Contrary to the assumptions made by the influential body of work produced by John Rawls (which, in construing as more or less homologous contract theory and the protection of freedoms takes individuals to be more or less equal to one another) Pateman insists that such assumptions merely gloss over the radical inequalities that pre-exist contracts, and which end up being consolidated by them. In the words of Brooke A. Ackerly, “social contract theory mischaracterizes an experience of being dominated as an exercise of freedom and autonomy” (77). Since the inequalities that predate contracts are endemic and structural, at issue here is not just the possibility that contracts might be bad, in the sense that certain parties might be coerced into them. Rather, as Anne Phillips argues, “we need to recognize that contract itself can be inimical to freedom” (102). To the extent that the point of a contract is to subordinate one party to another, it is, by its very nature, exploitative.

It is a hallmark of this volume that it does not restrict itself to commentary on Pateman’s body of work, but rather operates at the level of critical and creative engagement with themes she has brought to light, sometimes expanding them to areas not necessarily central to her concerns, and sometimes pitting her theoretical interventions against those of other political theorists. Thus Moira Gatens explores how Pateman stacks up against Joan Scott and Wendy Brown, while Alan Ryan explores how she stacks up against Schumpeter, whose work Pateman engaged early on. Robert E. Goodin shows how Pateman’s analysis allows an appreciation of the extent to which the work that women typically perform within the household depends upon them being irreplaceable, and how it is irreducible to being cashed out in the monetary terms dear to the Chicago school of economics. Philip Pettit extends Pateman’s reflections on the need for democracy to be genuinely participatory to the boardroom or the work of various committees and associations, including civic, governmental, and religious ones.

Issues that complicate Pateman’s original formulations include the increasingly complex sets of relations that combine to bring into question any assumption about the integrity of embodied persons. Surrogacy, and the trafficking of body parts are just two such instances. The commodification of human organs poses a problem for any theory of democracy that appeals, however implicitly, to the reliance of the health of the body politic on the notion that civic institutions are made up of persons whose embodiment confers on them an integrity that remains intact. Well-established practices of genital mutilation (clitoridectomy, etc.) have long exposed the mythical status of bodily integrity, but the trafficking of bodily organs, in particular by those who populate the world’s lowest income brackets, aggravate the need to attend seriously to this question.

I have focused largely, in this review, on The Sexual Contract, undoubtedly the most influential of Pateman’s works, but the Illusion of Consent does not restrict its attention exclusively to this work. Jane Mansbridge opens the volume by delineating some of the major contributions of some of Pateman’s other works.

This volume is pervaded by the sad circumstance that Iris Marion Young, one of the editors, was unable to see its completion. Her passing is a great loss to feminist philosophy and political theory. Her important work, which she produced at such a prolific rate, set a high standard, and remains a crucial, intellectual landmark for so many of us working at the intersections of philosophy, political theory, and feminist theory, and will do so for a very long time to come.