Imaginal Politics: Images Beyond Imagination and the Imaginary

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Chiara Bottici, Imaginal Politics: Images Beyond Imagination and the Imaginary, Columbia University Press, 2014, 258pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231157780.

Reviewed by Laura Hengehold, Case Western Reserve University


Situations in which citizens deliberate and act are framed by images as well as words. These images may be perceptual, photographic or moving video; they may be conscious fantasies, and they may involve unconscious expectations or hopes. Arendt suggested that Kant's unwritten political philosophy was contained in passages from the Critique of Judgment dealing with aesthetic judgment's capacity to mobilize an ideal common sense on the world's appearance, regardless of empirical disagreements between observers. But toward the end of her life, Arendt herself became increasingly focused on the role of imagination in judgment, rather than in action.

Chiara Bottici takes up Arendt's attempt to rework this aspect of Kant. What kind of Copernican revolution, the reader is invited to wonder, would allow each generation to tie the knot between reason and perception in pursuit of a freedom that was genuinely political and not merely individual, going beyond autonomy as self-legislation? Would such a revolution take a phenomenological or genealogical form? Bottici argues that restricted definitions of both imagination and politics have dissuaded political philosophers from this task. Two specific antinomies have plagued discussions of imagination. The first is the conflict between the ancient belief that imagery is essential to everyday thought and modern philosophy's claim that imagination is "unreal" or alienating (by contrast to whatever is defined as perceptually, empirically real). The second is the conflict between imagination conceived as an individual faculty and the "imaginary" conceived as one way that humans, perhaps unconsciously, absorb the content of their cultures.

Bottici's way through these two roadblocks is to consider all images equally, at least on an initial pass, regardless of their ontological status or their individual or collective origin. Fantasies about what is unreal often motivate changes in reality, and the results of individual and collective imagination influence one another. Bottici groups all these phenomena together under the "imaginal," a term borrowed by Henry Corbin and Cynthia Fleury from the medieval Iranian philosopher Sohravardî, in hopes of dissolving the antinomies. Her method, however, is genealogical rather than transcendental -- not in Foucault's sense (Foucault is cited only for his theory of biopower) -- but in Nietzsche's sense of an inquiry into the historical crises that produced our current, somewhat paralyzing terms. We find evidence for such crises when words suddenly change meaning or are replaced by new ones. The Sufi origin of the term imaginal, stripped of its original theological and ontological content, points to the crisis currently pushing our vocabulary forward, a crisis the word may help to reframe.

Although we are surrounded by images, our capacity to envision and experiment with political alternatives seems remarkably weak. If we fail to understand how images mediate politics, particularly the ways that they condense associations and conflicts at the pre- or unconscious level, Bottici warns that we risk allowing images to do "politics in our stead" (11). She identifies three primary causes: the omnipresence of still, video, and digitized images in our environment; the transfer of political power to international financial and administrative agencies as part of globalization; and the increasing responsibility borne by legal and political institutions for decisions regarding biological well-being and development -- matters once considered "pre-political."

When an image-saturated environment is combined with lack of local control over the conditions of well-being, many populations experience a crisis of significance. This void cries out for political myths -- or for forms of public rationality that reflect the reality people may be able to communicate more powerfully with images of injustice or the good life than with words. But conceptual obstacles have also kept critical theorists from appreciating that images make a legitimate, positive contribution to the process of group decision and conflict resolution. Thus Bottici also calls for a new kind of critical theory, one more willing to trust the aesthetic and particularly the visual dimension.

In Part 1, Bottici explores the evolution of terms associated with imagination, such as phantasia -- which Plato and Aristotle considered a valid element of empirically oriented thinking, but modern philosophy relegated to "fancy" and associated with creativity rather than with knowledge. The "imaginary" is a second term that appeared mid-twentieth-century in response to the impact of mass society and media on individual thought patterns. But Bottici is concerned by the apparent opposition between self and society as well as the cultural determinism that seem to follow from many discussions of the social imaginary.

Part 2 follows this analysis of obstacles to philosophical thinking about imagination with a similar genealogy of terms for "politics" from antiquity to Max Weber. The Greeks, she argues provocatively, had no term for politics as we understand it today -- a "peculiar kind of power characterized by the potential recourse to the use of legitimate physical coercion" (81). Just as modernity gradually consigned imagination to the realm of unreality and ideology, so too the reference of ta politika (matters affecting the city in all respects) was reduced to the realm of affairs in which a state could show its authority independent of religion. The imaginal was largely left outside.

Despite the relatively recent surge in imagistic production, Bottici believes that politics has always implicitly been imaginal, since the idea of community always evokes some sort of image. For example, early modern sovereignty evolved alongside new kinds of maps homogenizing territory under a single monarch, and the metaphor of the "body politic" made sense of the sovereign's purported capacity to represent those he might also repress. In tracing this genealogy, which considers the circumstances of newer terms like "the political" and "biopolitics," Bottici also draws on Weber's insight that legitimacy is partly a matter of perception and Arendt's claim that action requires the ability to imagine the world otherwise.

Again, if a new word like "the imaginal" is needed, this is because the effect of images on the nature and purpose of politics is no longer merely quantitative but also qualitative. Bottici refers to Guy Debord's notion of the "spectacle," which built on Marx's observations about the domination of consciousness by commodities. According to Debord, inhabitants of consumer cultures seem determined to act as if they were in an advertisement for capitalism. But the spectacle of today's social media and news is increasingly detached from products and "real" situations of consumption. Authorities often seem to act for the sake of an imaginal sphere that requires its own events and maintenance. Finally, images that seem to condense a sentiment of hitherto repressed or unacknowledged reality trigger massive public action, as with the uprisings around the Arab world in 2011. In the modern "spectacle," as Bottici puts it, the crucial distinction is not between those who win or lose elections, but between those who are worthy of being filmed or imagined and those who are excluded altogether from representation (112).

Imaginal Politics contextualizes Bottici's prior research. In A Philosophy of Political Myth (2007), she refrained from identifying myth with superstition, error, or individual fantasy. Even the concept of "fetishism," introduced by Marx and reworked by Žižek to apply to the kinds of disavowal Bottici herself describes, reflects the dismay of early European anthropologists at the variety of ways cultures deploy the aesthetic dimension. Moreover, while religion may figure in political myths (if only as an obstacle or danger), Bottici considers these different phenomena. As Hans Blumenberg contends, myth has an existential rather than an epistemological function, providing a sense of significance rather than information or explanation. Bottici's example, explored with more detail in other publications, is the "clash of civilizations" motif. Constantly referenced in the rhetorical structure of speeches and reports, sometimes by the same experts who then dismiss it as overly simplistic, this idea is on its way to becoming "real." Her answer is not to smash idols or reason them away, so much as to reason with and against them on their own terms. Just as her earlier book argued that myth may have a critical function, here she suggests that images can be used "homeopathically" against themselves, referencing Rousseau as well as the Situationist practice of détournement.

Blumenberg is still present in Imaginal Politics, but Bottici's main interlocutors are now Cornelius Castoriadis and Arendt. Castoriadis believes that all determinate social structures draw stability and legitimacy from a background (or magma) of indeterminate social and individual anticipations. But citizens can only be autonomous if they subject this already-instituted imaginary to critique and renewal. Today, the social imaginary is increasingly preoccupied with self-legitimation through horrifying and exhilarating images of biological health and risk. However, despite Arendt's effort to detach politics from biological well-being and Giorgio Agamben's claim that sovereignty has always been about the right to select those who will die, Bottici believes that politics has always been about life and needs, much as it has always involved the imaginal. Arendt's claim that action is an example of human natality implies nothing less. However they die, humans are always born in the company of others and want to see the world through the eyes of those they admire, while they beg others to share their own point of view. Bottici believes that if Castoriadis had been willing to identify human individuality with the phenomenon of birth rather than with being-toward-death, he could have avoided an apparent dichotomy between the (potentially oppressive) social imaginary and the (potentially liberatory) individual use of radical imagination. This basically feminist insight is one of the most interesting and potentially fruitful moments in the book.

By beginning from the imaginal, Bottici hopes to change the reasons political philosophers ask about the reality behind images and imagination, and to promote a practice of freedom that goes beyond the narrow definition of "autonomy" as rational self-legislation (188-189). The third section of Imaginal Politics examines how this might affect discussions of religion and human rights in contemporary global politics. In his later work, Rawls turned to the "reasonable" as a way to form a pragmatic accord on principles between groups for whom these principles might reflect different forms of rationality, appropriate to different comprehensive doctrines or religions. Bottici compares the "imaginal" to the "reasonable." Critical attention to both axes would allow groups and individuals to agree on the concerns represented by different kinds of images, while assigning them varying levels of ontological and normative weight.

Religion is one institution that promises to fill a void of political significance via images. But Bottici believes that the discourse of human rights, traditionally justified with respect to the dignity of human reason, might also benefit from open reference to the imaginal. Images of the "human" may conceal prejudice, but they also motivate us to recognize and name abuses, thereby improving our use of rationality. Human rights, like political legitimacy, are not an idea or an institution Bottici will consider "imaginary" if that implies "unreal." But human rights are often aspirational, contested, and motivated by a felt sense of commonality that is easier to envision than to describe or deduce.

In the conclusion, Bottici's double genealogy leads her to envision a new critical theory reuniting anarchism with Marxism, particularly with respect to a common notion of freedom. However, this would be a freedom whose content is more robust than self-legislation (Kantian or otherwise). Rather than the freedom some of us already experience and consider a source of competition unless managed from above, this would be a kind of freedom yet to be created. Bottici considers Marxism superior to anarchism when it comes to analyzing the material conditions for freedom, but notes that anarchism has always been friendlier to feminists. Moreover, she believes that the networks associated with globalization could realize the conditions of decentralization Bakunin called "federalism," although she admits that today's networks seem to be producing anything but the freedom of equals. How these conditions are to be overcome, particularly through the imaginal, remains a promissory note.

Bottici brings together French, German, English, and Italian political thinkers, many untranslated, and opens the path for readers to explore similar topics in the Arab world. This alone is a major philosophical contribution. Like Castoriadis, she draws on psychoanalytic (Freudian, Lacanian, and Jungian) as well as phenomenological texts, and situates their contents with respect to contemporary analytic philosophy of mind and discussions of public imagination in Martha Nussbaum and Charles Taylor. While I may not agree that Freud is ultimately a realist about imagination, or believe that Castoriadis digs quite so deep a chasm between individual and social experience, these are small issues given the book's overall coherence and relevance.

Bottici does not try to include all those who have theorized imagination and the imaginary, and she explicitly limits the imaginal to the quasi-pictorial. However, I did wonder why Walter Benjamin is cited only on the aura's demise in the age of mechanical reproduction, although his concept of an indefinitely divisible image-space resembles Bottici's notion of the imaginal as a category of images with varying degrees of relation to "reality." Nor is Bergson mentioned, though Matter and Memory begins by proposing to solve the debate between realism and idealism by appealing to the materiality of images, considered as such, and the "univocity of being" defended by Deleuze would certainly lead him to treat all images equally. I was surprised because Bottici, like Bergson, insists on the creative and not merely reproductive capacity of imagination, and is also, like Arendt and Benjamin, concerned with its contribution to action. Are these thinkers, like Sohravardî and Corbin, overly concerned with the ontological status of the imaginal? Is Benjamin too focused on its "dialectical" status and Bergson on its "physiological" aspect? On the other hand, how (else) can we account for the eye and mind encountering these imaginal contents and being shaped by them?

I am skeptical that any pictorial image, regardless of its "reality," can be divorced from other sensory aspects of the world or from some kind of body -- even as a methodological strategy. It seems to me that images of any kind are defined by a tacit border or frame, and imply acts of framing, reframing, connecting and cutting. These acts have something to do with what motivates the acting (as well as the reasoning) human being. Bottici does not deny this, but I would like to see more discussion of how images can be used "homeopathically" against themselves to promote the freedom of equals. Perhaps this will be another book. In the meantime, her argument for the genuinely political significance of images is insightful, wide-ranging, and exciting. It may well bring unity to discussions about imagination and media in cultural studies, anthropology, and political philosophy that are too often eclectic.