Imagining and Knowing: The Shape of Fiction

Imagining And Knowing

Gregory Currie, Imagining and Knowing: The Shape of Fiction, Oxford University Press, 2020, 240pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199656615.

Reviewed by Peter Lamarque, University of York, UK


Few would dispute that, all things considered, some exposure to works of imaginative literature (novels, plays, poems) as part of a rounded education is better than no such exposure. Beyond that, disagreements are rife. Culture wars loom, with anxieties over curriculum choice, gender and racial bias, elitism, contested pedagogic methods, and a disconcerting vagueness about aims sought.

In this important and polemical book, Gregory Currie sidesteps direct engagement with these heated controversies at the frontline of educational policy but nevertheless shines a penetrating, for some disturbing, light on one of the most prominent lines of defence for a humanistic, literary education, the thought that we can learn from works of fiction in substantial ways: that reading fiction can make us better people, more wise, more morally astute, more empathetic, more knowledgeable about human follies and aspirations. Currie does not deny outright that such benefits can accrue, but warns that our confidence that this is so is often misplaced and ill-grounded.

It is a salutary lesson and puts a serious damper on the so-called "cognitivist" project specifically in philosophy of literature, but more widely in aesthetics itself. It might also alarm those on the frontline, for example, teachers of literature, beset with the culture problems, who want something solid to help justify what they do. They will be all the more concerned because Currie's arguments rest not on airy philosophical speculation but on hard empirical evidence, or, as he believes, the poverty of such in the humanistic program.

In line with its title, the book has two central points of focus, Imagining and Knowing. The first Part addresses the former, the other two Parts, the latter. In fact, the topics are closely intertwined with a central theme binding them together: that fiction "has a happier, deeper, and more stable relation to imagination than it does to knowledge" (217). Although Currie does not seek to define "fiction", only to ask "what role does that concept play in our life?" (1), he does hold that there is an essential connection between fiction and imagining. His base notion of a "fictive utterance" is that of an utterance "intended to convey the intention that the audience imagine what the utterance expresses" (30). This is a view familiar to readers of Currie, and a version was first proposed in his book The Nature of Fiction (1990). Much of what appears in this first Part consolidates and expands on work he has done since that 1990 book, on both fiction and imagination. It is valuable to have it spelt out with clarity and precision in this new context. Currie takes the opportunity to address his recent critics, notably those who deny any essential connection between fiction and imagining (for example, Stacie Friend and Derek Matravers).

Let me single out two points of note in this revised treatment, the first on fiction, the second on imagining. Currie insists that the notion of fiction he is exploring (closely connected to imagining) is not "historically restricted" but "is vital for anyone, at any time, who is negotiating the human social world" (26), recognisable in Greek drama, medieval romance, and "in just about every time and place of recorded culture" (26). This universalism about fiction stands in sharp opposition to much historicist literary history. It is not to say we cannot be mistaken in distinguishing fiction from non-fiction or that in different historical periods there have not been finer distinctions drawn in this context. To support his contention, Currie suggests that the relevant conception of fiction is rooted in an underlying concept that which is non-deceptively fabricated for imaginative purposes (27), which is not dependent on the fluctuating history of the term "fiction". However, while we might agree with Currie that there is no good reason to think that fiction is an essentially modern idea, it would take more argument to establish that the sophisticated concept so described really is trans-historical and trans-cultural. Currie's main defence is that being able to recognize things fabricated for deceptive purposes is pretty essential for human social life. Maybe, but that is still several steps from the richer concept he needs.

The second point of note in Part I, occupying a substantial portion of that Part, is a distinction between different kinds of imagining: those that are belief-like, desire-like, and emotion-like. Currie calls these "representation-dependent states" (67). The core claim here is that what looks like "believing" that Othello killed Desdemona is not a real belief as such, only belief-like imagining; or apparently "desiring" that Othello does not kill Desdemona is not itself a real desire, only an "i-desire"; or apparently "pitying" Desdemona in this predicament is not real pity but "quasi-pity", an emotion-like imagining. Using a different example, Currie spells it out like this:

What satisfies my imagining that Anna is unhappy is not her being so, but her being represented in a certain novel as so; what satisfies my i-desire that she be happy is not her being so but her being represented in the novel as so (and so my i-desire never is satisfied); what makes my quasi-pity for her appropriate is not facts about her which make her pitiable but facts about how she is represented as being (67).

The influence of Kendall Walton is evident here (acknowledged on p. 67) and one might suppose there are significant parallels between what occurs, according to Currie, in the imaginings elicited by fictions and what occurs, on Walton's account, in a game of make-believe. This is not surprising as Walton takes games of make-believe to prescribe imaginings. But there are differences as there is no role in Currie's account for "props" in games.

Currie's discussion of fiction and imagining plays a crucial role in the later discussion of knowing and learning. But the role is not just that of a neutral theoretical background. On closer inspection it comes to seem that Part I in fact strongly stacks the odds against learning from fiction, as debated in Parts II and III. This might seem ironic, as the strongest arguments against learning from fiction in the later Parts are supposedly based on empirical evidence. But if Part I is right, the undermining of learning from fiction is already firmly established, not empirically but a priori, through conceptual analysis.

Why suppose that? As already indicated, at the heart of the discussion of fiction and imagining in Part I is the distance established between what happens in the real world and what happens in the imagination. The distinction between belief and imagining is centrally important here. Belief aims at truth and is constrained by how things are in the world; imagining, at least as elicited by fiction, is constrained by how things are represented in fiction. So immediately there is a question mark over how we can reliably move from what is represented in fiction (and imagined) to what is true in the real world and worthy of belief. And if real desires and real emotions are somehow insulated from imaginings then the gulf seems to grow ever wider.

It is sometimes argued that Aristotle's account of the eliciting of pity and fear in tragedy, leading to catharsis, is partly an account of how tragedy can educate the emotions. By experiencing pity and fear in the controlled context of a drama we come to understand these emotions better. But if Currie is right, we do not experience pity in watching a tragedy, only "quasi-pity". And who needs to be trained in quasi-pity?

That might seem an isolated example. But the wider direction of travel in Part I, emphasising the gulf between belief and imagining, is indicated in a remarkable passage in Chapter 6 where Currie toys with the idea that just as beliefs and emotions are locked into a kind of pretence involved in imagining (in Walton's terms, in games of make-believe), so learning from fiction itself might be a kind of pretence. After all, it is not outlandish to characterise engagement with fiction as pretending we are reading and learning about real people, knowing they are just fictional characters with no reality outside the story. It is a short step to suppose the pretence extends beyond that:

What I suggest now is that fiction engages us in a further act of pretending: the pretence that we are learning from the story, not just about its characters and their doings, but, in some indirect way, about things which lie beyond the events and characters of its story, which are suggested by them and which may be intended to be communicated by means of the story. (107)

It is not entirely clear how committed Currie is to this suggestion. But he is not dismissing it and accepts that "we dip in and out of pretence mode without fully realizing what we are doing" (110). It reinforces the point that some of the real work casting doubt on learning from fiction is done through the conceptual machinery of Part I.

So what is to be said about learning from fiction? For one thing, it "outruns that which is propositional, and that which is knowledge" (80), without of course discounting different species of knowledge. Currie states that his focus is on "learning about thought, action, and human conduct rather than about representations of these" (82), which might seem surprising given the importance of representation in the account of imagining. In fact, if the pretence view of learning from fiction is right, then it is a mere illusion that we are learning about thought, action, etc., while real learning is restricted to representations. That said, learning about representations is not an insignificant aspiration (for example, for teachers of literature).

To test the kinds of payoff postulated by "friends of learning from fiction", Currie runs through numerous potential candidates. Here are some. Propositional knowledge -- historical or geographical facts. Currie concedes that this kind of knowledge can be acquired from fiction, subject to reasonable assumptions about authorial reliability, while accepting that it is not at the heart of the "humanistic tradition" of learning from fiction (165). Knowing-how (82ff), rather than knowing-that. This seems more central to that tradition: the acquiring, from fiction, of skills and dispositions, perhaps to empathise or to "mentalize" (grasping the mental states of others, Chapter 7). I will return to comments later. Acquaintance (86ff), or knowing-what-it-is-like. Here is another putative, much touted source of learning: becoming acquainted with experiences of different kinds, being in prison (89), perhaps, or slavery (103). Understanding (90ff) -- being able to explain something or knowing why such-and-such. Currie is unsure how best to locate this within other species of knowledge, suggesting it might include the ability to ask the right sorts of questions (93). Works of fiction as thought experiments (135ff) -- the use of made-up scenarios to test a hypothesis and advance knowledge. This is another popular conception for those who support learning from fiction, and Currie gives it detailed consideration, mostly by way of comparing literary fictions with paradigmatic thought experiments in science and philosophy. His conclusion, in summary, is that essential features of literary fiction -- narrative complexity and the centrality of style -- seriously detract from any substantial or epistemically rewarding parallel.

Currie's response to all these putative modes of learning is simple: what is the evidence that learning has taken place? In all cases he finds it weak or lacking. Again, at the heart of the matter is the gulf between what is real and what is imagined. Take the case of mentalizing and the thought that reading fiction can improve our skills in "mind-reading" through attending in imagination to the complex psychological interactions of fictional characters.

Fictions . . . provide us with an easily won certainty about mental events that ordinary experience could never provide. This raises the concern that our ability to penetrate deeply into the minds of fictional characters may provide a misleading picture of mind-reading 'in the wild', generating an unrealistic confidence in our ability to understand others. (123)

Or what about our supposed ability to learn what it is like to have experiences of a certain kind? Again, Currie thinks it is not clear-cut.

Whatever imaginative experiences are generated, stored, and recalled as a result of reading, there is no evidence to help us decide what relations those imaginative experiences have to the experiences people actually have in the situations we are imagining, and hence no evidence to support the claim that fictions can help us to know what experiences we have never had are like. (102)

As for fiction enhancing empathy, there is equal evidence, so Currie believes, in the opposite direction, that "the effect of fictive empathy may sometimes be to dampen or occasionally suppress its real-world counterpart" (199).

What are we to make of this? The constant call for evidence in this context might raise the spectre of a Gradgrindian positivism which insists that if literature has value it must manifest itself in measurable effects. But it would be unfair to saddle Currie with such a view. His position is only that if you insist that the value of fiction lies in what can be learned from it (in the ways described), then it is incumbent on you to provide some evidence that such learning actually takes place. That evidence, he thinks, is rarely forthcoming.

One natural -- to my mind, attractive -- conclusion might be that the value of fiction lies elsewhere than in beneficial and observable effects. Why not enjoy fiction "for its own sake"? Might there not be reward enough in being absorbed, through thought and imagination, in a work of art, aspects of which might find a permanent location in the mind, for enduring reflection and pleasure? Currie does little to develop any such positive direction of thought, but that is not his project. It might be something, though, to offer those embattled teachers of literature.

I admit to being very sympathetic to the sceptical (or as he would say "cautious") approach to learning from fiction, even if I have less confidence than Currie in the authority of empirical data arising from psychological experiments designed to measure desirable outcomes from reading fiction. However, let me end with a brief comment on a point of apparent disagreement, on fiction and truth. Currie finds a view of mine and Stein Haugom Olsen's (in Truth, Fiction, and Literature) "extremely implausible" (172). The view, in summary, is this: that in thematic analysis of literary works by literary critics, the focus of interest is less on the (worldly) truth of some statement than on how effectively, in a work, a theme is developed or concepts explored. If a theme is characterised as, say, "hope springs eternal", what matters to the critic is how that theme emerges from the particulars lending added interest or significance to them. The critic would not be disconcerted to find another work where a prominent theme could be summarised as "hopelessness prevails". There is no sense of a conflict or contradiction that needs to be resolved, nor will the critic spend time delving into the psychological or sociological literature (on hopefulness) to help establish which of the two points of view is true; and how absurd it would be for such a critic to delay a value judgment on the works until the truth of the matter is determined. Put simply, other factors than the truth of these statements will be at the core of such evaluations. This is essentially the argument in the passage Currie objects to. He dislikes the playing down of truth.

However, from other things Currie says, it becomes clear that the differences between us are not so great. Although he insists that "truth is a contributor to literary value" (a statement open to different interpretations -- truth of what?), he does concede that "the practices of literature do not function to take that value [i.e., truth] seriously" (181). This was a point Olsen and I made: that critics do not characteristically sit around debating the (worldly) truth of thematic statements. Currie is also right to notice that "critics who make quite startling claims about the psychological truthfulness (or otherwise) of authors hardly ever argue for these claims" (180), a point that somewhat weakens the examples on p. 173, where authors and critics are quoted making grandiose claims about their own or someone else's literary truth-telling, offered as a challenge to me and Olsen.

Furthermore, Currie concedes that "when truthfulness is invoked in criticism, it often seems to mark the achievement of some vivid effect, with no very close connection to the idea of being right about anything in particular" (185) and "the audience for a piece of narrative art . . . is simply not tuned to the issue of truthfulness, and is likely to be swayed by powerful emotional forces unleashed by the work itself" (186). He also recognises that literary themes, like the kind in my example, are often so general and vague as to make serious truth assessment problematic (165): "authors . . . rarely have reason to fear that their views on love will be identified with enough precision to be refuted, or, if identified, that hard evidence against those views will be found" (171). In all these respects, Currie and I are not far apart.

The book is a major contribution to debates about fiction by one of the pre-eminent philosophers in this area. It contains an immense amount of subtle argument, presented in a pleasing and urbane manner, the author always generous to his adversaries, modest in his own conclusions. But make no mistake, the book completely changes the landscape of "cognitivism" about literature. No one now can go on insisting on the usual beneficial effects of literature without taking serious and systematic account of Currie's arguments. Not to do so in future will count as intellectual negligence.