Immanuel Kant, Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime and Other Writings

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Immanuel Kant, Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime and Other Writings, Patrick Frierson and Paul Guyer (eds.), Cambridge University Press, 2011, xlv + 348pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521711135.

Reviewed by Robert B. Louden, University of Southern Maine


Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime and Other Writings is an important collection of eight different Kantian texts from the 1760s, chosen primarily to highlight the development of his ethical theory and anthropology. Most of the selections are culled from various volumes in The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant (Cambridge University Press, 1992- ), but the editors have also included a few new gems. Kant's 1764 Observations is the best-known work in the group, but since it fills only 49 pages of a 393-page book, the emphasis should really be on the "other" in the title. So let me begin by offering a brief overview of the eight texts.

Thoughts on the Occasion of Mr. Johann Friedrich von Funk's Untimely Death (1760) started out as a letter of consolation that Kant sent to the mother of a recently deceased student. Translated by Margot Wielgus, Nelli Haase, and the editors, this short text has never before appeared in English. Kant biographer Manfred Kuehn calls it "one of Kant's most peculiar publications" [Kant: A Biography (Cambridge University Press, 2000), 126], but I think Karl Vörlander comes closer to the heart of the text when he notes that is "written in an energetic, almost poetic, and, despite the cliché, unrequited language, here and there spiced via a famous phrase from Lucretius, Haller, or Pope" [Immanuel Kant: Der Mann und das Werk, 3rd ed. (Fourier, 2003), I: 88]. In many of the texts represented in this anthology, we find a Kant who is more rhetorically engaged than his later self of the 1780s and 90s -- particularly the Kant who wrote the Critique of Pure Reason in what the poet Heinrich Heine called "such a colorless, dry, packing-paper style" [Zur Geschichte der Religion und Philosophie in Deutschland (1834) (Reclam, 1997), 96]. And this should not surprise us when we remind ourselves that Kant was offered a professorship in rhetoric and poetry in 1764. Thoughts -- precisely because Kant's theme is death, which "seems to be far away" but "suddenly brings the whole game to an end" (2: 41/5) -- tops the list in this respect.

Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (1764), the lead text, was translated by Paul Guyer and appeared first in Anthropology, History, and Education (2007; paperback, 2011). Traditionally treated as a pre-critical work in Kantian aesthetics, Patrick Frierson rightly argues in his "Introduction" that this popular, short book is best read as one of Kant's proto-anthropological writings (xxiii-xxvi). For while Kant does analyze and differentiate the concepts of the "beautiful" and "sublime" at some length in the opening First Section of the book, in the remaining three sections they are employed primarily as foils to bring out alleged differences between human beings, particularly with regard to gender, national character, and race.

The Remarks in the Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (1764-65), by far the longest text in the anthology, are a series of notes that Kant wrote into his own copy of the Observations, which he had interleaved with blank pages. In these valuable personal reflections one can witness key features of Kant's mature ethics first emerging; e.g., the distinction between hypothetical and categorical imperatives (20: 149-50, 156, 162/168, 172, 177) and the importance of universalizable maxims (20: 67, 161/110, 177). Although the Remarks were first published in their entirety in 1942 in volume 20 of the German Academy Edition, this English translation is based on the more recent and reliable edition edited by Marie Rischmüller (Felix Meiner, 1991). However, Rischmüller's text is now out of print and difficult to come by, and this translation wisely includes both Academy Edition and Rischmüller pagination. Some selections from the Remarks are also available in Notes and Fragments (2005; paperback, 2010), but this is the first complete version of the text to appear in English. The present translation, completed by Thomas Hilgers, Uygar Abaci, and Michael Nance, builds on Guyer's earlier effort in Notes and Fragments, as well as an earlier draft by Frierson and Matthew Cooley as well as yet another one by Robert Clewis. This new translation is a definite improvement over its predecessor. One intriguing feature, never before used in Cambridge University Press editions of Kant's writings, is the use of a struck-through font to indicate material that Kant crossed out. Rendering Kant's personal notes into readable English presents multiple challenges to translators, and given the importance of the Remarks for tracking Kant's philosophical development, it is safe to say that the inclusion of this particular text is the most valuable feature in the entire anthology.

Essay on the Maladies of the Head (1764), also reprinted from Anthropology, History, and Education, was translated by Holly Wilson. This short essay appeared originally as an anonymous publication in five installments in the Königbergische Gelehrte und Politische Zeitungen, edited by Kant's former student and friend, Johann Georg Hamann. Inspired in part by local reports about a Polish "goat prophet" and religious fanatic, in this piece Kant attempts "to imitate the method of the physicians" (though his own penchant for classification schemes is also clearly evident) by providing a taxonomy of mental illnesses or "frailties of the head" (2: 260/206).

Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality (1764), sometimes referred to as the Prize Essay (though the prize was actually awarded to Moses Mendelssohn -- Kant's effort came in second), was originally submitted to the Berlin Royal Academy of Sciences, addressing its announced theme of the application of mathematical proof to the field of metaphysics, with special reference to natural theology and morality. This particular translation appeared first in Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770 (1992; paperback, 2003), and was undertaken by David Walford. The style of the Inquiry is more formal and academic than the other texts in this anthology, but its message is similar. Regarding ethics, for instance, Kant announces that "the faculty of experiencing the good is feeling" (2: 299/246), and that "Hutcheson and others have, under the name of moral feeling, provided us with a starting point from which to develop some excellent observations" (2: 300/247). Frierson observes in his "Introduction" (xvi-xvii) that this stress on moral feeling is surprisingly close to what Schiller and other romantic critics of Kant's mature ethics advocated, though of course this is precisely what we do not find in Kant's later writings.

M. Immanuel Kant's Announcement of the Program of his Lectures for the Winter Semester 1765-1766 (1765) was one of five different advertisements that Kant published at his own expense during the time that he was an unsalaried university lecturer and dependent on student fees. This translation also appeared originally in Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770 and was also undertaken by David Walford. The 1765 Announcement is famous for its endorsement of Enlightenment ideals of progressive education -- e.g., finding a way to make education "more adapted to nature" (2: 305/251) and encouraging students to "learn to philosophize" rather than to memorize facts about philosophy (2: 306/253; see also Critique of Pure Reason A 838/B 866). But in his description of his upcoming ethics course we also find the same emphases on "the human heart" and on the need to ground moral philosophy in "the study of the human being" (2: 311/258) that we find in other 1760s texts. And the closing description of his physical geography course as "an entertaining and easy compendium of things which might prepare … [students] and serve them for the exercise of practical reason" (2: 312/259) signals a theme that becomes even more dominant in Kant's later anthropology course: offering students a practical map to help them find their way in the morally ambiguous real world after they leave school.

Herder's Notes from Kant's Lectures on Ethics (1762-64) were written by one of Kant's most famous students, Johann Gottfried Herder. While his Notes are neither the most detailed nor the most reliable transcription available of Kant's numerous ethics courses, they are the only published account from the 1760s. In these particular Lectures, Kant advocates "an ethic for man, determined in his nature, by his knowledge, powers, and capacities," adding that it "has yet to be written" (27: 62/293). Alas, this is not the ethic that he later writes, opting instead for one that "does not just hold for human beings only" (Groundwork 4: 389). And the strong sentimentalist message sounded in other 1760s texts is also present: "The sole moral rule … is this: Act according to your moral feeling!" (27: 16/271). This abridged translation of the Praktische Philosophie Herder, undertaken by Peter Heath, appeared originally in Lectures on Ethics (1997; paperback, 2001).

The last text, Selected Notes and Fragments from the 1760s, has two sections ("Notes on anthropology prior to 1770" and "Notes on moral philosophy prior to 1770"), and is taken from Kant's handschriftliche Nachlaß. These handwritten remains comprise 10 volumes in the German Academy Edition, and the present selection, which appeared originally in Notes and Fragments and was translated by Guyer and Frederick Rauscher, offers only a tiny bit from volumes 15 and 19. In the Notes on moral philosophy one can clearly see Kant moving away from his temporary infatuation with Hutcheson's sentimentalism ["Hutcheson's principle is unphilosophical, … it sees objective grounds in the laws of sensibility" (19: 120/336)] and embracing the concept of universalizability that later becomes a hallmark of his ethics ["An action that is good in and of itself must necessarily be good for everyone, thus not related to feeling" (19: 124/337)].

Like other volumes in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series (which presently includes seven other works of Kant), this one also contains a critical introduction, a guide to further reading, and an index. Frierson's detailed "Introduction" (marred only by an occasional incorrect Academy page reference to Kant's writings) pays careful study and offers an excellent orientation to the volume as a whole. Frierson rightly stresses not only the strongly sentimentalist and anthropological cast of Kant's ethical theory in the 1760s that I have also highlighted in my above summary of the eight texts, but many other important issues as well. For instance, in commenting on Kant's extensive remarks about the relationship between men and women in the Observations and Remarks, he points out that they are "not observations of a disinterested philosopher" (xxxii). Rather, they reflect at least in part Kant's own "deeply personal struggle about marriage" (xxxiii). One does not need to read too far between the lines to find multiple autobiographical passages which show Kant wrestling with and slowly moving away from the option of marriage.

As Frierson observes, the texts collected in this anthology "hint at what Kant might have become had he embraced the more elegant and popular style of philosophizing that clearly attracted him during the 1760s" (xi). Some readers will no doubt prefer this possible Kant to the real Kant, and Frierson himself may be in this group when he refers to the "more balanced conception of ethical life" found in these texts; a conception that "fits better with critics of Kant's later ethical thought than with the picture of him that many have found in the Groundwork" (xix). But perhaps this is only a different way of saying that Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime and Other Writings is an exciting yet affordable collection that both Kant's friends and even many of his foes will enjoy reading.