Immigration and the Constraints of Justice: Between Open Borders and Absolute Sovereignty

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Ryan Pevnick, Immigration and the Constraints of Justice: Between Open Borders and Absolute Sovereignty, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 199pp., $82.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521768986.

Reviewed by James Hudson, Northern Illinois University


As suggested by his subtitle, Ryan Pevnick aims to offer a moderate view of the ethical constraints on immigration policy, a compromise between libertarianism and what he calls "statism" -- this latter being the view that a nation and its citizens have no responsibility at all to foreigners who wish to immigrate and so may freely exclude them. His position is thus comfortably non-extremist. In his view, countries such as the United States (which is his focus, though much of the discussion aims at greater generality) have some rather weighty responsibilities to admit very poor or victimized foreigners (to permanent residency and, eventually, to citizenship), but are not unjust or otherwise morally blameworthy for excluding most would-be immigrants.

In support of this position Pevnick offers his "associative ownership" theory -- not a general theory of sovereignty, but an account of an aspect of sovereignty that is especially relevant to immigration policy. On this theory the true citizens of a country are those who have helped to create or maintain its political institutions (and perhaps some of its non-political social institutions: the range of the relevant institutions is not made quite clear). These people have, as individuals and (I think we must add) as a collection, something very much like a property right in their nation. Strictly speaking, the property right is in the nation's institutions, but Pevnick claims that in practice these will be inextricably linked with a certain territory. This quasi-property-right gives them considerable latitude in preventing others from enjoying the benefits of living under those institutions and, therefore, in that territory. Considerable latitude, but not a completely free hand: they are, and their nation as a whole is, still bound by certain constraints of morality or justice in treating would-be immigrants.

Thus Pevnick rejects "statism" by (plausibly enough) upholding the moral requirement (which he considers a requirement of justice) of "rescue" -- a requirement to help others who are in dire need and whom one has the means to help without greatly sacrificing his own interests, a requirement that applies regardless of the nationality of the potential beneficiaries. But as a merely individualistic principle, applying just to the actions of individual people, this would not obviously serve Pevnick's purpose; my duty as an individual American to any particular needy foreigner seems intuitively to be quite slender. Implicitly Pevnick is giving the principle a collectivist extension, so that it binds the actions not only of individuals but also of such collective entities as nations. It is normally the nation as a whole, not any individual citizen, that determines its immigration policy; and clearly the sacrifice incurred by a nation in allowing any particular foreigner to immigrate is relatively small.

Now, the United States (in particular) does partially conform its actions to the rescue principle by admitting refugees from war and from persecution. But it does not acknowledge what Pevnick sees as its considerable obligation to allow entry to desperately poor foreigners who are unable to gain a decent living in their own countries. Here Pevnick makes his closest approach to a policy proposal that is in any way radical -- that is, not squarely within the mainstream of practical political discussion in the U.S.

Pevnick does not tell us at what point this collective obligation would lapse if there were so many extremely poor foreigners that admitting them all would be seriously harmful to the nation. Nor does he consider the suggestion that the responsibility to provide opportunities for these desperately poor people falls primarily upon other governments, not on that of the U.S. (I follow Pevnick in ignoring the distinction between a nation and its government.) Nor does he consider other measures the U.S. government might take to help the foreign desperately poor besides admitting them to the country as immigrants. These omissions prevent his support for an open-door policy toward "economic refugees" from being fully convincing.

By setting up statism as a fundamental principle of political morality, Pevnick easily finds intuitive grounds to reject it. But its advocates might better view it as a derivative, secondary rule, holding that under present international political circumstances it is generally best not to treat nations as being morally bound to look after the well-being of people not under their jurisdiction. The derivative-statist would maintain that world affairs are at present so structured that, in the long run, each nation had best concentrate on serving its own (enlightened) self-interest. Pevnick does not address this more modest version of statism, the evaluation of which would require a rather messy enquiry into empirical matters.

Pevnick follows the common practice of political philosophers by moralizing about collective actions, the agents of which are collective entities such as nations, more or less as if they were individual actions performed by individual people. But arguably he, and they, should give more attention to whether a collectivist morality modeled on the familiar individualist morality can simply be added to the latter without producing conflicts.

Obviously Pevnick's commitment to "associative ownership" is a sort of rejection not only of statism but also of the libertarian "open borders" view. I call it a "sort of" rejection, for in passing Pevnick often shows himself to be sympathetic to a very open immigration policy for the U.S. He writes: "Sidgwick argues that though open borders policies are not requirements of justice, they are nevertheless [usually] optimal. I do not wish to rule out this kind of argument in favor of open borders." (p. 80) But neither does he put forward such an argument himself, which would require -- besides much empirical material -- that he spell out his overall theoretical normative view, specifying (for example) how he thinks justice, optimality, and perhaps other considerations figure into the larger moral picture. Instead he contents himself with a rather vague intuitionism, in which potentially conflicting intuitions about rights, distributive justice, the production of utility, and whatnot are weighed against each other by a sort of meta-intuitive faculty, in a style made familiar by W. D. Ross. Given constraints of space under which he was operating, this may have been the most practical course.

Pevnick is at pains to distinguish his view from its close cousin, the culturally communitarian "shared identity" view (which he also calls "liberal nationalism"). On one version of "shared identity," "the possibility of a just society depends on citizens sharing a common public culture or national identity." (p. 14) But as Pevnick sees it, the important justification for excluding foreigners is not that they fail to participate in the citizens' cultural community and their consequent mutual cultural bond -- as he remarks, some foreigners may in fact be culturally similar to the average citizen -- but that, unlike the citizens, the foreigners have not earned a stake in the local political institutions. He brushes aside the shared-identity theorist's empirical claim about a necessary cultural precondition for the practical institution of justice, pressing instead his own argument about the direct requirements of justice in the abstract.

Pevnick's presentation of his associative ownership view is rather sketchy, leaving unanswered many important questions about citizenship. I doubt that he can give a satisfactory account of the extent of original citizenship in a newly founded nation, but let us put that aside. Even for the task of specifying what one must do to merit full membership in an already-existing nation his account is insufficiently detailed. As he would have it, present-day membership is a matter of somehow having contributed to the modification and the maintenance of the national institutions; but we are not told if these institutions are the purely political ones, or whether other social institutions -- linguistic, religious, esthetic, broadly "moral" (manners, customs, dress, etc.) -- might be relevant. There is also a (notably circular) rider -- aimed at undermining the claim of a long-time resident illegal alien -- that in order to qualify him for citizenship a person's contribution must be made with the consent of the other citizens. The extent of the contribution required for citizenship is not specified (nor is the anti-contribution -- the destructive or subversive activity -- that would forfeit citizenship); many other such questions are not addressed.

The idea of citizens as being, at least in the first instance, those who have earned a quasi-property-right in the national institutions has considerable appeal and may well figure in the popular view of immigration issues. Pevnick had done well to highlight it, and it merits a yet more detailed development than he has been able to give it here. But while its merits are evident in broad outline, a more detailed examination might well reveal insurmountable flaws.

A particularly noticeable omission from Pevnick's account concerns the possible alienability of the individual citizen's quasi-property-right: may he voluntarily transfer it to someone else, as bequest or gift, or in trade? Pevnick's appeal to Locke (Chapter 2, section III, et passim) suggests an affirmative answer, since Lockean property is transferable; but the rest of his discussion seems to assume a negative one.

Assuming inalienability, a citizen may not bequeath citizenship to even one of his or her children, and obviously babies have not contributed politically (or socially); yet many babies are treated as citizens (though others are excluded). It seems to me that Pevnick will have to view this recognition as a sort of arbitrary gift from the citizenry as a whole, thus treating the collectivist property right, unlike the individualist one, as including alienability.

Indeed, in the United States, though not in many other nations, not only do the children of citizens get citizenship by right of birth: non-citizens' children who are born in America are granted this privilege. What does Pevnick's theory imply about the propriety of this treatment of babies?

His explicit statement implies that even the American rule is, in a way, too restrictive: for he holds that all people, even children of illegal immigrants, who from fairly early childhood (not necessarily from birth) have grown up in the U.S., with little exposure to any other culture, deserve recognition as American citizens. On the other hand, his overall position seems not to require him to endorse birthright citizenship in general: a baby born in the U.S. but reared in some other country would have no principled claim to U.S. citizenship.

Though much of his treatise is quite general, Pevnick often focuses on the case of the present-day United States. In a somewhat tantalizing aside, he writes: "The considerations relevant to the United States are insufficient for considering the legitimacy, for example, of Israeli immigration policy." (p. 18) Yet he gives the case of Israel almost no consideration. Let me suggest that no general treatment of immigration can afford thus to ignore cases of the Israeli type.

As a coda to the main corpus of the book -- his general presentation of "associative ownership" and his criticism of statism and Open Borders -- Pevnick discusses and favorably evaluates the possibility of a guest-worker program for the present-day United States, suggesting improvements over the twentieth-century bracero program. One of his arguments for a (humane, generous, and quite large) guest-worker program is the impracticality of strictly enforcing a strongly exclusionary immigration policy. But this is a consideration that comports ill with the highly abstract considerations that dominated the rest of the book. He asserts that, while the U.S. has the right utterly to exclude non-distressed foreigners, enforcing such a ban would require draconian measures that would prevent the achievement of other more important goals. But might not some of these goals be morally required, in which case the U.S. would not, after all, have the right to exclude? After the highly abstract deontological theorizing (involving rights, justice, and the like) of the main body of the book, it is somewhat jarring to find considerations about the practicability of various rules thus brought in late: should they not have been raised earlier?

Pevnick does not mention any limitation on the duration of guest-worker status; for all he says, it might last until the worker's retirement or death, without earning him citizenship rights. But guest workers must be adults; where children are concerned, denial of citizenship is objectionable, because (normally) they will not have had the chance to develop ties to the culture of their parents' nation. Here, as throughout, Pevnick relies on a sharp distinction between adulthood and childhood, with his treatment of children fitting easily into the cultural communitarian framework that he rejects in application to adults. (He emphasizes the inability of foreign-born children raised in the U.S. to form ties to the foreign nation's culture, rather than their inability to make contributions to the foreign nation's political institutions.) But there is no sharp distinction between child and adult. This fact, I suggest, constitutes a theoretical difficulty for Pevnick's view; he should, at least, have discussed the borderline cases -- adolescents. Admittedly, most of the considerations that figure in his discussions throughout the book are matters of degree, which can be reflected only imperfectly in the inevitably crude categories of law and public policy.

Despite its flaws, most of which are omissions (I find myself making the common reviewer's complaint that the book is too short), Immigration and the Constraints of Justice is quite a competent performance, expressing a plausible overall view with many sensible and some penetrating observations. It is a welcome contribution to the current debate on immigration policy.