In Defense of Gun Control

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Hugh LaFollette, In Defense of Gun Control, Oxford University Press, 2018, 237pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190873363.

Reviewed by Firmin DeBrabander, Maryland Institute College of Art


Hugh LaFollette has offered an informative, compelling and readable contribution to the philosophical literature on America's gun debate, which, as of yet, is still relatively small. He gives an overview of three major sets of arguments for and against gun control: armchair arguments, rights based arguments, and empirical arguments. He appraises each in turn, and ultimately points out how and where the gun rights position is wanting, and why the case for gun control is stronger. He concludes by detailing several proposals for gun control. These include some well-known (and much debated) regulations, like gun registration and background checks on gun purchases, but one idea that is rather novel and little discussed, mandatory liability insurance for gun owners.

LaFollette leads off with what he calls 'armchair arguments' -- arguments for easy access to guns, or arguments against. By 'armchair arguments,' he means "common sense" arguments, where "the empirical elements of the reasoning lay in the background rather than the foreground," and are "supported by robust background knowledge of science, history, politics, and human behavior" (24-5). On the gun rights side, armchair arguments include the following: we will cause unanticipated and excessive costs in restricting the popular practice of gun collecting and gun use; we need unfettered access to guns in order to protect ourselves from harm, and from crime; and citizens require broad gun ownership in order to protect against government tyranny. Gun control armchair arguments, LaFollette says, are basically grounded in the conviction that widespread ownership of guns and easy access to firearms cause "an unacceptable level of harm" to society at large (40). Easy access to firerarms, gun control advocates claim, leads to higher incidences of violent crime, homicide, gun accidents and suicide.

In assessing rights-based arguments for or against gun control, LaFollette distinguishes between Fundamental Rights and Derivative Rights. In this section, he responds to philosophers who have written in support of the gun rights position, and notes that few support the fundamental rights position -- which would hold, for example, that I have a basic and natural right to own or carry a gun. If this sounds strange to hear, this is because gun rights are hardly ever articulated this way; it is more common to hear them articulated as derivative rights. For example, advocates will claim that my right to gun ownership derives from my right to be free from totalitarian government. Guns are the tools I require to free myself from or prevent such a regime. Or gun rights are derivative of my "right of self-defense against individual aggressors," and they are "the only (or best or most reliable or most effective or most reasonable) means of self-defense against aggression, either in or away from one's home" (77).

Here, LaFollette offers some compelling critiques. For one thing, he asks if guns are a necessary means to self-defense. That may not be the case, of course. Are guns handy tools, and useful in certain -- dire -- situations? Sure. But as a rule, they may not be, and are not in fact, necessary for the vast majority. I have written elsewhere that this gun rights claim -- that guns are a necessary means of self-defense -- makes sense only in a society where guns are prevalent, and gun laws lax -- so that gun owners can shoot me if I so much as appear threatening (thanks to Stand your Ground Laws).[1] In other words, we have needlessly produced a society rife with guns and lax gun laws, where one may indeed require a gun for self-protection; but it does not have to be that way. We could envision, and create, a different society. LaFollette notes that owning guns is not "generally and usually vital for an individual's security. The majority of people living in Europe and in the United States do not own guns and they flourish" (88). This latter point invokes another rebuttal to claims that the right to gun ownership is an important derivative right: gun rights advocates say we require guns to enjoy our freedoms, and the rights we have as democratic citizens -- freedom of speech, freedom of assembly, freedom from totalitarian government. And yet, most citizens of industrial democracies patently enjoy those freedoms, though they have few or no guns. Indeed, I have also argued, widespread gun ownership poses a greater threat to the rights and freedoms we enjoy as democratic citizens. Open carry, for example, is not going to make people more likely to speak with one another, or assemble, or engage in sometimes raucous protests against the government.[2]

LaFollette does not spend much time considering rights-based gun control arguments, which is not entirely surprising, since the gun rights movement is most insistent on this front. He briefly mentions one rights-based gun control argument: David DeGrazia's argument that prevalent gun ownership compromises our right not to be harmed. Our right not to be harmed is of course a necessary prerequisite for all the other rights we enjoy in a democratic society.[3] LaFollette announces that he sympathizes with DeGrazia's argument, but "will not discuss it here; those interested should read his discussion. I think the objections I raise here and later are sufficient to undercut the pro-gun advocates' argument" (90). But it might be helpful to look at an argument like DeGrazia's in this context, to understand what a rights-based gun control argument might look like, what sources it draws on, how it will be constructed, how it will fare, and how it may be vulnerable. Especially since LaFollette proposes to look at the gun issue from both sides, and with a strong degree of fairness and objectivity -- which he demonstrates in what I consider charitable treatment of gun rights arguments (see below) that have been thoroughly and widely questioned, if not debunked.

In any case, turning next to empirical arguments for or against gun control, gun rights advocates believe they have strong candidates on this front. LaFollette deals with two prominent figures in this vein: Gary Kleck and John Lott. Kleck has engaged in studies that, he claims, prove that guns are essential in the lives of ordinary Americans, because they are used in millions of incidents each year, to fend off criminal attack, and ensure personal protection. Kleck's survey "shows that there are 2.5 million DGUs (defensive gun uses) annually and also finds that defensive gun users have 'certainly or almost certainly saved' 400,000 lives annually"(141). Lott, by contrast, points to research that supports "shall-issue laws -- laws requiring authorities to issue carry permits to all but a small number of people," because they reduce "violent crime without significantly increasing accidental deaths" (144, his emphasis). Gun control advocates also believe they have drawn powerful and compelling arguments from empirical evidence, carried out by public health researchers. The "prohealth" approach, as LaFollette labels it, aims to propose regulations that can reduce the number of injuries and fatalities from the use of guns (147). Among empirical arguments are the following: gun control advocates note that jurisdictions with high gun ownership rates see higher gun fatality rates, on average; they also claim that high gun ownership rates correlate with higher rates of suicide; and widespread gun ownership, combined with lax gun storage and transfer laws, lead to higher incidences of accidental deaths and serious injuries.

LaFollette devotes a lot of time to discussions surrounding the empirical evidence. This is because he is alert to the problems of gathering and trusting empirical evidence, though gun control and gun rights advocates claim to rely heavily on it. It is very difficult to "find reliable empirical evidence," he notes (113). It is unclear whom to study, how, and for what -- as a general rule for empirical research; such decisions invariably frame, and limit, the study at hand. And empirical studies can go awry in many ways. But these problems are even more serious when it comes to "public policy issues," which "are neither practically nor morally amenable to [a high] degree of control and manipulation" (125). What's more, gun control studies are apt to lean on terms like 'safe' and 'risky' that are intolerably vague. By pointing this out, LaFollette means to say that empirical arguments in support of gun control are on equally shaky ground as those offered by gun rights opponents.

That said, Lott's and Kleck's work is liable to questions that are especially troubling -- and their findings are more dubious, as a result. For one thing, Kleck's study is supposed to correct for underreporting on DGUs in another well-regarded study, the NCVS or National Crime Victimization Study -- but Kleck's findings say that the NCVS underreported DGUs by 96%, which seems improbable. Kleck is also unfairly critical of the medical and public health community, who engage in similar and competing studies, considering them "rank amateurs employing primitive analytical tools" (171). Finally, Kleck makes the dubious claim that the 2.5 million DGUs per year have saved 400,000 lives -- without which, the US murder rate would be "nearly thirty times higher" than it is already (178). Our murder rate is already double that of Europe. Is Kleck really willing to accept that Americans are 60 times more murderous than our European counterparts?[4]

Lott's research has been the subject of academic criticism for some time now. Though its weakness is widely reported, it is still remarkable how Lott is regularly trotted out on cable news networks as a 'gun rights expert.' In short, Lott focuses on a highly selective collection of data in order to produce findings favorable to concealed carry. Researchers examining his supporting data "found that under minimally different conditions, the reported enormous benefits of shall-issue laws vanished" (183, his emphasis). What's more, Lott says his findings indicate that "for every 1000 additional people with permits, there are 0.3 fewer murders, 2.4 fewer rapes, 21 fewer robberies, and 14.1 fewer aggravated assaults."[5] It is strange to claim we should expect certain precise reductions in specific crimes; the causes and rates of crime are prone to murky and ambiguous variables, which make them hard to predict. And of course, LaFollette points out, there is the ridiculous implication that "if we issued 1.2 million permits throughout the combined six northeastern states, then there would not be a single homicide in that area of the country" (184).

Empirical arguments on behalf of gun control are preferable and more convincing, for one thing because they are more modest in their aims, and more honest about the gray areas in their research, and where they need to improve. In general, public health researchers simply aim to reduce the number of gun related fatalities injuries. They don't aim to make murder a thing of the past -- though I have heard numerous gun rights advocates attribute this preposterous dream to the gun control crowd. Gun control advocates also have more modest aims about gun regulations: again, contrary to what opponents say, they do not want a ban on the sale and ownership of guns -- all guns. They simply want to implement certain measures, which, by being tested in certain jurisdictions, might demonstrate efficacy in reducing gun fatalities. Among the likely measures, LaFollette briefly describes assault weapons bans, waiting periods on gun purchases, gun free-zones, repealing stand your ground laws, controlling private gun sales, requiring safer storage of guns; and revoking gun manufacturers' immunity from lawsuit. There is the added benefit, LaFollette argues, that none of these measures overly interferes with the rights of gun owners -- though they may say otherwise.

Though the tide may be changing of late, politics stands in the way of stronger gun control regulations. Simply put: the gun lobby has effectively galvanized voters and manipulated legislators to beat back even the most basic and sensible gun control regulations -- like universal background checks. Gun rights advocates command a lot of political clout; thus, it may well be difficult to enact some combination -- or any -- of the measures LaFollette recommends. That's why I especially like that he concludes by looking at a measure for "indirectly controlling guns" -- which draws on mechanisms of the free market, no less (207). He proposes that we require gun owners to purchase liability insurance, in case they or someone else inflicts harm with their weapons. This will amount to an indirect tax on gun owners, and reward the responsible among them, while punishing the irresponsible. After all, insurance companies will offer lower premiums to those who can demonstrate that they are responsible gun owners -- proving that they store their guns safely, for example, own fewer guns or less lethal guns, and undergo safety training. This way, the gun control movement can achieve many of its goals indirectly, and without the controversial coercion of law. What's more, LaFollette notes, the gun lobby already admits liability insurance is a reasonable measure, and recommends it for gun owners.

In general, I find LaFollette's book helpful to anyone thinking critically about the gun debate. Unfortunately, in my own work on the issue, and reflecting on the debate at large, I find that too few people think critically about it. In that regard, I do have some doubts about LaFollette's work: will gun rights advocates slog through his careful discussion of the shortcomings of empirical research? Will they then pay close attention to his analysis of Kleck's and Lott's findings -- which involves a meditation on the discipline of statistics, and its inherent challenges? I am dubious. But perhaps this book isn't really for them -- and perhaps I am just too worn down by the current atmosphere of political debate, which, in the age of Trump, is perfectly abysmal. If we return to a day when political opponents can actually engage each other in rational debate -- and truly listen to and respect one another -- then LaFollette's book will be most helpful. I hope. The problem is, gun rights advocates have long resisted the path of rational compromise; can we really expect them to change their ways and give in to reason, soon? Can we expect the American electorate to follow suit? The debate is horribly muddied by the gun lobby, the media, and the prejudices and fears and desires of ordinary Americans, who are too easily swayed by the cause of gun rights, even to support outrageous measures, such as Permitless Carry, legal in 11 states, where citizens can practice concealed carry without a permit, and no safety training. As a political philosopher, I would like to see first -- or also -- how we can ameliorate the political situation so that we can have reasoned moral arguments and practical legislative gains.

LaFollette delves extensively into what may seem like unnecessary tangents. Early on, for example, he discusses the history of firearms, how they were invented, and developed over the years. As mentioned, he also engages in thoughtful considerations of the nature of statistics and the inherent challenges of empirical research. And LaFollette prefaces his concluding section with a general discussion of liability insurance. I skimmed many of these sections, largely because I was already familiar with these subjects tangential to the gun debate. But I suppose these sections will be very helpful to people who are new to the debate -- or undergraduate students who are new to the world of liability insurance.

LaFollette points out something remarkable that I have also uncovered in my debates with gun rights advocates: they claim that opponents want a ban on guns. I am amazed how often I come across this argument -- though, as LaFollette rightly notes, very few gun control advocates ever hint at a ban. Where do gun rights advocates get this idea? They often claim that gun control is a slippery slope: when you start to admit certain modest gun control regulations, sooner or later the slope slides into a gun ban. Hence gun control advocates will supposedly not be satisfied until guns are banned. I would have liked to see LaFollette address this head on -- if only to help me in my own struggles to rebut this stubborn claim. When gun rights advocates say their opponents really want to ban guns, I typically note that we have already 300 million guns in America, and the legislative landscape heavily favors the gun rights position. How are gun control advocates supposed to reverse these 'facts on the ground' so quickly -- or at all -- to enact a ban on guns? It is a preposterous notion. Gun control advocates' approach is incremental, as LaFollette makes clear. They want us to take first steps in helping diminish the horrors we have come to deem normal, such as mass shootings in Sandy Hook or Columbine, and the daily drumbeat of gun violence in inner cities across the country. Theirs are eminently reasonable goals, affirmed by the fact that the US suffers by far the highest degree of gun violence among industrial democracies. We ought not to grow accustomed to this depressing fact.

[1] Firmin DeBrabander, review of Debating Gun Control: How much Regulation do we need? By David DeGrazia and Lester Hunt, Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, December 20, 2017.

[2] See Firmin DeBrabander, Do Guns Make us Free? (New Haven, Connecticut: Yale University Press, 2015).

[3] See David DeGrazia and Lester Hunt, Debating Gun Control: How much Regulation do we need? (New York: Oxford University Press, 2017).

[4] See "Murder Rate Drops to 33 year low," ABC News, October 15, 2018,; "Regional Homicide Profile: EUROPE," in "Global Study on Homicide 2018," United Nations Office on Drugs and Crime.

[5] John Lott, More Guns Less Crime (Chicago, Illinois, 2010), 178.