In Dialogue with the Greeks, Volume I: The Presocratics and Reality; Volume II: Plato and Dialectic

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Rush Rhees, In Dialogue with the Greeks, Volume I: The Presocratics and Reality; Volume II: Plato and Dialectic, edited by D. Z. Phillips, Ashgate Publishing Company, 2004, 142 pp and 300 pp, $89.95 and $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 0754639886 and 0754639894.

Reviewed by Patricia Sayre, St. Mary's College


The two volumes comprising In Dialogue with the Greeks are aptly titled: they represent a genuine dialogue with Greek philosophical thought. Culled from Rhees' lecture notes and bolstered by student notes taken by Donald Evans, they show us something about what it is to take the Greeks seriously, engaging not simply in scholarly exegesis of their questions but struggling with those questions for oneself. These are not reflections directed to experts interested in technical issues of interpretation. Nor are they systematic surveys of primary sources suitable for the uninitiated, for they presuppose familiarity with those sources. Rather, they are records of a dialectical interaction with the deepest and most difficult issues in philosophy, and an invitation to the reader to become part of the on-going dialogue.

A dialogic mode of philosophizing is inherently more complex than one proceeding systematically to develop a theory or argue a case, for to enter into dialogue with a given philosopher's thinking is always to enter into a whole network of dialogic relationships. Sometimes these relationships can only be traced by employing historical hindsight, as when Rhees puts various of the Presocratics into dialogue with one another and with Plato. Other times these relationships, in all their complexity, shape the dialogue as it develops. Much of the richness of these volumes is owing to other of Rhees' conversation partners whose philosophical encounters with the classical world were undertaken in much the same spirit as his own -- Simone Weil, Søren Kierkegaard, and, of course, Ludwig Wittgenstein. For all three of these thinkers philosophy is an important and yet inherently problematic enterprise, and for Rhees as well worries about the nature of philosophical investigation are never far from the surface. In his helpful introduction to Volume I on the Presocratics, D.Z. Phillips identifies its central theme as the sense, if any, in which philosophy investigates the nature of reality. That philosophical discourse has an essential link to reality, but that it is all too easy to misconstrue the character of that link, is a theme carried forward in the second volume on Plato, where it is amplified against the background of the threat posed by the sham discourse of the Sophists.

As Rhees sees it, philosophy has been concerned with language from the beginning, and it is that concern which tethers philosophy to reality. By investigating the conditions that make discourse possible, the philosopher limns the parameters of the space within which reality can reveal itself to us and make itself understood. The Presocratics are thus best read as offering something more akin to a "geometry or grammar within which things can be discussed" (I, p. 9) than a highly generalized physics that stands or falls on the basis of empirical evidence. Thales' enigmatic views about water, for example, Rhees reads as "a phraseology in terms of which you can talk about things, compare them and, in an important sense, understand them." (I, p. 2) This is not, of course, the way the Thales has typically been read, and the misreadings go all the way back to Aristotle, and, in an important sense, to the Presocratics themselves. Time and again, as Rhees works his way painstakingly through the implications of the claims of a given Presocratic thinker, he notes conceptual advances but concludes that confusions generating new philosophical puzzles have arisen due to a failure to distinguish clearly enough between the conditions making it possible for us to say things and the things we actually say.

The Pythagoreans' attention to abstract mathematical reasoning, for example, led to greater clarity than their predecessors, the Milesians, achieved regarding the need for a unified logical order as the backdrop for any intelligible account of reality. To their credit, they saw that without a logically necessary framework to provide a shared space in which discourse can take place, we are subject, as Heraclitus also later realized, to "the disaster of turning aside each one into a world of his own." (I, 32) And yet, Rhees notes, "It is one thing to say that logic is fundamental to science, but quite a different thing to claim that all science can be derived from or reduced to logic." (I, 13) The Pythagoreans, in sliding from a conception of the unit as that which measures to a conception of the unit as that out of which things are constructed so as to in turn be measured, failed fully to appreciate this difference -- as did Empedocles, whose roots are sometimes unchanging elements making it possible to speak of change and sometimes physical constituents of changeable things, and as did Anaxagoras, whose seeds embody a confusion between the grammatical possibility of infinite divisibility and an actual compositionality out of an infinite number of parts.

In conflating the unity of reality with the unity of a thing, these thinkers all compound a difficulty lurking in Presocratic philosophy from the outset: how to relate the realm of timeless grammatical necessity to the temporal order of empirical observation. The more sharply articulated the distinction between the frame and that which it frames, the more devastating is the misbegotten importation of some feature of empirical reality into the realm of logic. Hence, while Parmenides corrected errors in Pythagoreanism by drawing a radical distinction between the philosophical claims constituting the Way of Truth and the descriptions of particular states of affairs constituting the Way of Appearance, he was unable to resist the temptation to import the concept of existence from the latter realm into the former, where "it is" must utterly exclude "it is not" on pain of logical contradiction. But, as Rhees convincingly argues, this plunges the Way of Truth into incoherence, for it only makes sense to say what is when it also makes sense to say what is not.

Critical ripostes of this sort, however, should not lead us to adopt a dismissive attitude toward the Presocratics. If there are mistakes here, Rhees writes, they are "important ones … [for] the importance of philosophy is found via such mistakes." (I, 17) The Wittgensteinian flavor of this last pronouncement is characteristic of those occasions when Rhees' own voice enters most explicitly into the dialogue between these early Greek thinkers. Sometimes insights of the later Wittgenstein are brought to bear, as when Rhees, in his very effective disentangling of Zeno's paradoxes, appeals to the different grammatical roles the distinction between the one and the many can play in different contexts. It is the Tractatus that comes most frequently to mind, however, as Rhees tentatively explores resolutions of the problems associated with the Presocratics' efforts to get at that which makes discourse possible. The account of logical space offered by the early Wittgenstein provides reality with the logical unity they sought, but avoids Parmenides' error by insuring that what it is logically possible to affirm it is also always logically possible to deny. More generally, the Tractarian account of the propositions of logic as tautologies that say nothing, but whose truth is necessarily implied by our saying anything at all, offers an elegant solution to the problem of identifying a prerequisite common to all thought that does not require any further prerequisite of a similar sort. The price the early Wittgenstein paid for adopting this strategy was, of course, that his results could only be shown and not said -- and at times Rhees seems to want to push Presocratic philosophy toward a similar conclusion. As he puts it when commenting on Parmenides, the unity of the world is not "something that can be thought … it has to be lived through." (I, 27)

The Presocratic philosopher who seems to have grasped this insight most clearly is Heraclitus, whose "ethical pronouncements intertwine with his account of the natural world" (I, 39). For Heraclitus, as Rhees reads him, the human soul is caught up in the same transformational matrix as all of reality. The value of a transformation depends on whether it is generative or degenerative, and the soul capable of discerning between these is an awakened soul whose contemplation of the logos guiding the operation of nature "is the same as obeying it." (I, 40) The resonance here with Simone Weil's concept of obedience is unmistakable: we have no choice but to obey, it is simply a question of whether we will obey blindly or with understanding.

One of Rhees' chief concerns as he moves from the Presocratics to Plato is how to achieve this understanding so that the transformational patterns constituting our own lives can be viewed generatively rather than degeneratively. The key to living a generative life, or, to put it in the language of Plato's Symposium, a life governed by the desire to beget, is to develop one's powers of attention so as to be "interested in something -- or in a person -- for what it is" as opposed to being "concerned with utility or gratification." (II, 40). What is required, again echoing Weil, is an opening of self to penetration by a reality that transcends the self. To the extent that we can pull this off, we approach resolution, in our own persons, of the conflict between the temporal and the eternal. In cultivating the capacity to appreciate the other "for what it is", we develop a correlative sense that it would be "a horror to wish to change it" (II, 47). This, Rhees says, is at the heart of discerning what it means to be eternal. However, because this capacity to be penetrated by the eternal can only develop over time, we are caught up in a paradox of involved detachment that, in Kierkegaardian fashion, synthesizes the temporal and the eternal in an unconditional commitment to a reality larger than ourselves.

As the previous set of maneuvers suggests, Rhees sees an important continuity between the Presocratics and Plato. Indeed, it is Socrates' concern with the same issues these earlier thinkers addressed that sets him in opposition to the Sophists. The project of forcing us to confront our own ignorance is at bottom a continuation of the concern with the conditions required for genuine discourse. To be able to genuinely affirm something as true, we must grant the possibility that our affirmations might be mistaken, a possibility the Sophists in effect deny. In thus severing the tie between language and reality they do not merely give false accounts, but undermine the very notions of truth and falsity; their discourse is no longer real discourse, but has something phony or sham about it. It is an imitation that, like much of our recent political discourse -- and, no doubt, much of the political discourse of Plato's own time as well -- can be enormously seductive and, for that very reason, profoundly disturbing.

The task of philosophy in the face of this threat to genuine discourse is to cultivate sensitivity to the difference between the real and the sham. For those of us doing philosophy in contemporary academic settings, however, Rhees suggests that what is most likely to be cultivated is an interest "not in the work we are doing, but in the recognition it may bring us." (II, 44) The sham philosophical discourse resulting from our distracted pursuit of prestige is, as Rhees credits Plato with seeing, the most dangerous sham discourse of all; it not only robs us of the possibility of genuine discourse, but blinds us to the fact that it has done so. How, then, are we to break the spell of the sham in philosophy? One message that comes through loud and clear in Rhees' reflections is that no mechanically applicable "technique" can help us here. To desire such is "servile," and philosophy should be about breaking out from servility into the freedom that allows one always to submit oneself and one's views to examination. True philosophers follow an argument wherever it takes them, taking their time no matter how much time it takes.

Wittgenstein once wrote, "Sometimes a sentence can be understood only if it is read at the right tempo. My sentences are all supposed to be read slowly."[1] Similarly, to benefit from reading these volumes you need to read slowly. Read quickly, they can seem a superficial, repetitious, somewhat incoherent collection of allusions to halfway developed ideas -- or, worse yet, a sham version of a style Wittgenstein perfected in his later thought, but which it is well-nigh impossible to imitate with any authenticity. Read slowly, however, Rhees' reflections take on a dimension of depth. One begins to appreciate that the allusive quality of the prose is born of a deep familiarity with the material, and that far from merely echoing Wittgenstein, Rhees is developing Wittgensteinian themes in his own way. It is fascinating to watch as, in the course of Rhees' dialogue with them, the unifying Tractarian impulses of the earlier Greek thinkers gradually gives way to the recognition, common to both the later Plato and the later Wittgenstein, that "we move about in various systems of communication while we are speaking the same language, and this gives our speech the character it has." (I, 103).

A thorough review of the material on offer in these volumes would have to consider issues concerning the relationship of mind and body, of personal responsibility and public justice, of knowledge and belief. It would look at the role of beauty in revealing to us the point of our lives, at the forms as conceptual constants that enable discourse regarding the real, at the relationship between knowledge in the special sciences and philosophical wisdom. It would consider the ways in which we individuate things, the interplay between sameness and difference that makes possible a world, the relationship between being and becoming. It would consider the nature of education, both moral and otherwise, the character of social existence, the role of desire in human life. In short, it would tackle just about every major philosophical issue there is -- not, however, with the expectation of providing any easy answers, and not in a combative spirit that looks for opportunities to score easy critical points. These volumes will display their worth only if approached with that spirit of benevolent disputation of which Plato speaks in his Seventh Letter; only then is there a chance that the self-sustaining spark of authentic insight both he and Rhees value so highly will be generated.[2]

[1] p. 65e, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Culture and Value, revised edition, ed. G. H. von Wright, Blackwell Publishers, 1998.

[2] 341d and 344b, Plato, Letter VII in Collected Dialogues, ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns, Princeton University Press, 1961.