In Praise of Heteronomy: Making Room for Revelation

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Merold Westphal, In Praise of Heteronomy: Making Room for Revelation, Indiana University Press, 2017, 241pp., $30.00, ISBN 9780253026613.

Reviewed by R. S. Kemp, Wheaton College


Most historical scholarship falls into one of two basic categories. There is, on the one hand, work that operates at the micro level: it aims to explain the finer mechanics of an argument or to document the full-range and nuance of a concept. A second type paints in broader strokes: it takes scholarship of the first kind and attempts to explain its wider importance. It looks to capture the spirit of a thinker at the occasional expense of the letter. This book is an admirable example of the second type. Merold Westphal weaves a convincing historical narrative that raises important questions for contemporary philosophy of religion, especially in the Continental tradition.

Westphal’s stated task is to capture the general features of Enlightenment accounts of “Universal Reason” in order to show that they do not live up to their own standards. This will, he hopes, open up a space to consider (perhaps even “praise”) the merits of more “heteronomous” accounts, including those informed by “mere Christianity”: the “common core of the revelational faith shared by the Eastern Orthodox, Roman Catholic, and Protestant traditions of Abrahamic monotheism” (xxi). These traditions are heteronomous because they affirm that a human being’s highest calling is authored by a “voice [that is] independent of and transcendent to any and every version of human reason” (xx). They confess faith in a personal God who speaks into history.

Limiting his analysis to a trio of Aufklärung giants — Spinoza, Kant, and Hegel — Westphal identifies a common commitment to the purity of reason: the idea that there can be a priori and presuppositionless1 knowledge of significant metaphysical and practical truths that, in turn, permit strong rational autonomy. This kind of autonomy is a function of an agent’s legislative independence: she needn’t depend on anything outside of her own powers of reason (e.g. church, society, God) to determine who she is and what she ought to do. Westphal thinks that autonomy of this sort is a fiction and sets out to establish this by showing that each of the above thinkers endorses a distinct species of pure reason. If this is right, he will have shown that a key tenant of the Enlightenment model is false: there is no single monolithic thing that answers to the name “Reason.” Even granting this, however, Westphal will have yet to justify full-on praise of heteronomy. There are, he admits, plenty of thinkers who are prepared to acknowledge the limitations of the Enlightenment model without going so far as to embrace the kind of revelational commitments that form the backbone of mere Christianity. Westphal will thus spend the last two chapters motivating his particular brand of heteronomy over and against thinkers who take the “hermeneutical turn” in a stringently atheistic or agnostic direction.

Though I intend to sketch the first part of Westphal’s account (the first 9 chapters devoted to the Spinoza, Kant, Hegel narrative), the last two chapters deserve as much attention. Westphal confirms the relative importance of these chapters when he admits that his historical narrative provides only “an indirect word in praise of heteronomy” (189). Furthermore, he claims in the preface that “one doesn’t need to delve very deeply into Spinoza, Kant, and Hegel to see that such a claim [i.e., that reason is universal and pure] is not just false but plainly false.” While I initially found this claim to be a bit puzzling (after all, the book devotes most of its pages to arguing exactly this), I think it says more about the primary audience of this book than anything else. Though Westphal occasionally wades into contemporary interpretive debates (especially in the Kant chapters), the book is designed to work at a higher altitude that makes it accessible, even enjoyable, for someone who has only limited exposure to the primary source material, much less to the secondary disputes. This also means that readers who are prepared to embrace the thesis of the early chapters may find more at stake in the last two chapters.

Though Westphal is concerned to show that Spinoza, Kant, and Hegel are no friends of confessional theism, he also wants to make clear that they are comfortable working within its idiom. In this respect, they can each be said to have their own “theological” and “hermeneutical” assumptions. Developing each thinker’s commitments in terms of these assumptions allows Westphal to frame the dispute as denominational, something that is conducive to his ultimate goal of introducing “mere Christianity” into the conversation. This conceit also lends a natural structure to the text that I will follow in my summary. After my summary, I raise some points of modest concern.

Westphal’s sketch of Spinoza’s theology is brief and, by his own account, “[doesn’t] offer anything new” (29). He is concerned to clarify the relationship between Spinoza’s “God” and the object of traditional Abrahamic worship. Though both Spinoza (of the Ethics) and the larger monotheistic traditions confess belief in an infinite and eternal substance, Spinoza denies that God is personal: he (or perhaps more appropriately “it”) neither has a will, nor is capable of love in anything like the common sense of the term. Though Spinoza has the philosophical resources to distinguish God (“natura naturans”) from the world (“natura naturata”), Westphal thinks he is best understood as a pantheist: “there cannot be the world without ‘God,’ and there cannot be ‘God’ without the world” (30).

Westphal turns to Spinoza’s Theological-Political Treatise in order to develop his hermeneutics. There, he finds a commitment to a core Reformation theme: sola scriptura. He goes on to argue that, for Spinoza, among the presumptions an interpreter shouldn’t bring to Biblical texts is a presumption of truth. Spinoza offers two reasons in defense of this move. First, the biblical writers have no special access to the truth about God: “they articulate human traditions, not divine truth” (44). Second, the authors of the Bible think in the language of the “imagination,” an inferior mode of thought that is not especially conducive to truth, particularly in cases where metaphysical questions are at stake. Because Spinoza associates the highest mode of thought (“intuition”) with reflective reason, philosophy takes interpretive precedent over imaginative media like scripture. The problem with this account, Westphal thinks, is its dependence on an obviously false account of the capacities of human reason, the idea “that philosophical reason rises to an ethereal realm of nature uncontaminated by anything smacking of nurture” (48).

For Kant’s theology, Westphal directs us to the “fourth Critique,” Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. Of the three thinkers scrutinized in these early chapters, Kant’s God comes closest to the deity of mere Christianity and accordingly warrants closer attention. Westphal argues, first, that it is misleading to say (as one might of Spinoza) that Kant reduces religion to morality. Because Kant insists that practical reason requires faith (Glaube) in theological items as various as God, an afterlife, repentance, and grace, Westphal joins people like Stephen Palmquist in suggesting that Kant’s project is one of “raising morality to the level of religion” (62). Another important difference between Spinoza’s and Kant’s respective Gods is personality: Kant’s God is an agent with purposes. This leads Westphal to categorize Kant as a “deist”: he affirms a “personal God” who is both intelligent and free. While it is apparent that Kant’s distinct account of practical reason gives rise to a need for a distinctly un-Spinozistic deity, it remains unclear whether Kant’s God meets a key condition of Abrahamic monotheism: whether he makes promises and issues commands. Westphal takes up this issue in his examination of Kant’s hermeneutics.

As Westphal has already argued, Kant’s interest in God extends only as far as his interest in morality. He now turns to explore whether this “natural religion” makes room for revelation. He argues (against the likes of Denis Savage and Allen Wood) that Kant is a “pure rationalist.” He grants that, while it is permissible to affirm the reality of revelation, such revelation is not required to execute one’s moral duties (91). The latter is part and parcel to Kant’s “hegemony thesis,” Westphal’s shorthand for Kant’s claim that “the a priori and presuppositionless religion of practical reason is the norm or criterion for interpreting . . . the whole of ‘revealed’ or ‘learned’ religion” (100). Kant’s approach is not designed, Westphal rightly points out, “to defend and promote Christian religion.”2 To the contrary, true religion is intended to replace its historical counterpart and will do so once humanity grows up a bit. For Westphal, the upshot of all of this is that there is a “deep chasm” between Kant’s dressed-up Christianity and the historical faith (118).

Westphal is keen to emphasize Hegel’s pantheism while also highlighting the ways in which it diverges from Spinoza’s. Like Spinoza’s, Hegel’s God is ontologically dependent on the world and does not exercise agency. Unlike Spinoza’s, however, Hegel’s God comes into being through historical development: with Hegel, we have a “pantheism of history” (141). This movement from nature to history is, as Westphal emphasizes, “essentially a matter of knowledge”: God gains reality as he gains self-consciousness. This convergence of the epistemic and the ontological means that a phenomenology of spirit, like the one that Hegel publishes in 1807, is also a proof of the existence of God. By drawing attention to the movement of reason through history, and the culmination of history in his own time, Hegel establishes God’s existence in the immanent bonds of society. Westphal is quick to note the burden this places on Hegel’s account of history. Not only must this phenomenology provide a non-tendentious rendering of each historical form of consciousness, it depends on a highly dubious assumption about the end of history. “Without the realized telos of history,” Westphal writes, “the strong claims [Hegel] makes for his philosophy . . . dissolve into a hermeneutical relativism” 156).

As with his accounts of Spinoza and Kant, Westphal focuses on how much of a voice Hegel is prepared to grant to confessional faith. On the face of things, Hegel is quite complimentary to Christianity: in both the Phenomenology and the later Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion, he calls it the highest form of religion, with emphasis on the doctrine of the incarnation. Westphal is, however, quick to point out that this title is presented with the left hand. Though the highest form of religion, Christianity’s revelatory potential is intrinsically inferior to that of speculative philosophy. Like Spinoza, Hegel develops a hierarchy of cognition with philosophical speculation taking pride of place. While religion reveals Absolute Spirit (or God) through “Representation” (Vorstellung), philosophy reveals it through “Concepts” (Begriffe). Implicit to this claim is the idea that religion and philosophy have the same content and different forms. Westphal draws attention to four ways in which Hegel contrasts Vorstellungen and Begriffe as they relate to religion and philosophy respectively. (1) Christianity represents God as present in a single person; philosophy locates the divine in community. (2) Christianity represents God as a distinct object of consciousness; philosophy depicts consciousness of the divine as consciousness of the self. (3) Christianity references a yet incomplete union with the transcendent; philosophy sees this union with the transcendent as fully realized. And, finally, (4) Christianity depicts the above story as a contingent happening, while philosophy demonstrates its rational necessity. The bottom line for Westphal: Hegel, like his Enlightenment predecessors, grants an all too (im)pure reason unjustified priority over historical religion.

As I have already suggested, the real virtue of Westphal’s narrative lies in the clarity with which it presents each thinker’s basic commitments and places them in contact with their historical neighbors. In this respect, he provides a panoramic view that is both convincing and scenic. In the case of Hegel especially, he brings to bear an impressive talent for translating the obscure into the readily comprehensible that makes these chapters a joy to read, even for the more experienced student. At the level of summary, there is not much to argue with here.3

At the same time, however, I occasionally found myself wondering what the importance of these chapters was for the more specific thesis of the book. When, for instance, Westphal claims at the end of his analysis of Spinoza that the latter’s account depends on the obviously false idea “that philosophical reason rises to an ethereal realm of nature uncontaminated by anything smacking of nurture,” he appears to help himself to an assumption that these chapters are supposed to motivate (48). If it is already obvious to most of us that Spinoza’s idea of Reason is a fiction, Westphal’s narrative — understood as a cumulative argument against such Enlightenment accounts — may be redundant. While Westphal admits that he occasionally engages in some choir preaching, one worries that, in this case, the choir may be so large that the imagined foe is merely fanciful (or, at least, long since dead).

Another worry relates to one of Westphal’s central inferences. It is not obvious that we can straightforwardly infer from the fact that three thinkers characterize “Universal Reason” in incompatible ways that it does not exist. Surely, its existence is compatible with a least some disagreement about its nature and limits. While I suspect that a plausible account is there for the taking, it would have helped me to hear why disagreement between these three thinkers about a thing of this sort allows us to draw the above inference. Relatedly, I wonder whether an updated version of the “Universal Reason” thesis might evade some of these worries. Some people, even in recent Continental discussions,4 seem to think that science can provide a non-perspectival account of at least some natural facts. Is science, understood in this way, sufficiently distinct from Enlightenment reason to evade Westphal’s criticisms? Perhaps.

Because I did not need much convincing to accept the idea that Enlightenment accounts of the power and purity of reason are overblown and idiosyncratic, I found the last two chapters of Westphal’s book to be the most interesting. Here, Westphal (in what he calls the “second stage” of his argument) defends his brand of heteronomy against those who have taken the hermeneutical turn, but are nevertheless reluctant to acknowledge mere Christianity and its ilk as viable normative alternatives. He accuses these thinkers (figures like Derrida, Gianni Vattimo, John Caputo, and Richard Kearney) of offering “outright rejections and systematic reinterpretations of Abrahamic monotheism . . . that are formally on par with those of Spinoza, Kant, and Hegel.” In other words, they “have not abandoned the project of religion within the limits of reason alone” (214). This project, Westphal insists, is only as viable as the Enlightenment epistemology that gave rise to it, and — we now know — the prospects of the former are quite dim.

Because the theoretical error of these “postmodern rational theologians” is so apparent to Westphal, he focuses his attention on certain practical worries that one might raise against Biblical heteronomy, things like its affront to human dignity or its tendency to alienate. In response to these accusations he offers, not an argument, but “testimony” (215). He appeals to two examples of Biblical heteronomy (the authors of the Psalms and the protagonist from C. S. Lewis’s Till We Have Faces, “Princess Orual”) to show that people who live within such traditions can do so happily. Though Westphal’s development of these testimonies is characteristically well done, it is not clear what — even at their strongest — they can achieve. I take it that the person who worries that such a life is inevitably alienated or in some way undignified also knows that some people who live within these frameworks report being happy, thankful, and blessed. The problem, if anywhere, lies beneath the surface.

In addition to being underwhelmed by the appeal to testimony, I found myself wondering where people who, with Westphal, openly acknowledge that reason does not provide reliable evidence of the truth of their basic normative commitments stand epistemically. While I can appreciate how belief in the transcendent might be justified before the kind of reflection he encourages, upon discovering — with Westphal’s help — the severe limitations of our rational capacities, one might expect belief to waver. This issue surfaces in an indirect way in Westphal’s preface, where he writes, “One can draw skeptical conclusions from [my] argument, if one chooses. I prefer Derrida’s response: the undecidable calls for decision” (xxiii). The thing to note here is the language of volition. Where we might expect Westphal to talk about the way in which his argument justifies or makes room for belief of a certain kind, he recommends an act of will. (I assume, out of charity, that this decision is not one of belief. The prospects of directly willing the latter seem poor at best.) This suggests that he at least acknowledges that his argument may have agnostic implications: a person is compelled to “decide” at precisely the juncture in which her beliefs give out. I raise this issue not to disagree with Westphal, but because I think it stands to draw him into closer conversation with the postmodern theologians he resists.

In conclusion, this is a wonderfully engaging book that will interest both scholar and student alike. It offers a compelling historical narrative that gives rise to questions of central concern to both contemporary philosophy of religion and value theory. While Westphal’s paean may not catch on with those who begin outside the fold, it goes a decent way toward motivating epistemic parity. At the end of the day, however, it remains to be seen whether this equality invites members of either camp to adopt a posture of praise. Autonomy is a comforting fiction.


Thanks to Christopher Lopez and Greg Lynch for their helpful feedback.

1 At the risk of redundancy I add “presuppositionless” because Westphal refers to two species of a priori knowledge: one with presuppositions and one without.

2 Here 116), Westphal is quoting Palmquist

3 Westphal’s chapters on Kant include more interaction with the secondary literature, especially essays from Firestone and Jacobs’s In Defense of Kant’s Religion (Indiana University Press, 2008).

4 See, for instance, Dreyfus and Taylor’s Retrieving Realism (Harvard University Press, 2015).