In the Age of Averroes: Arabic Philosophy in the Sixth/Twelfth Century

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Peter Adamson (ed.), In the Age of Averroes: Arabic Philosophy in the Sixth/Twelfth Century, The Warburg Institute, 2011, 288pp., £60.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780854811540.

Reviewed by Nahyan Fancy, DePauw University


In the Age of Averroes is a worthy follow-up volume to the earlier Warburg Colloquium publication, also edited by Peter Adamson, In the Age of al-Fārābī (2008). Just as the latter was intended to situate the well-known philosopher al-Fārābī in his "fuller historical context, the present volume aims to do the same for Averroes -- the one Muslim thinker of the time who people outside the field [of the history of Arabic philosophy and science] are likely to know about" (p. 2). As a cautionary note to those readers heavily invested in learning about the Commentator, though the volume devotes two articles to his works, Averroes's thought is by and large marginal to the discourse found in this volume -- reflective of the role it played in Arabic philosophy. However, this marginality of Averroes should not be seen as signifying the "death" of philosophy in Islamic lands. "Rather," as Adamson states towards the end of his introduction,

Averroes' lack of influence is probably to be explained by the fact that he sought to shield philosophy from the Avicennian revolution that was sweeping through the eastern world. Attacking or appropriating Avicenna was the way to participate in this revolution; trying to undo the damage by returning to Aristotle was not (p. 7).

The articles of this volume are thus fundamentally concerned with highlighting some of the key philosophical developments of this "Avicennian revolution" that took place during the first few generations after al-Ghazālī (d. 1111), the age of Averroes, for these developments left an indelible mark on subsequent philosophical thinking in the Islamic world up to the present day. As such, it builds upon the last two decades of scholarship which has identified the post-Avicennian period as a "Golden Age" or a "second formative period" of philosophy in the Islamic world.

In the Age of Averroes consists of thirteen essays by some of the leading figures in the field. The volume begins with a helpful introduction by Adamson that tries to thread the essays together into a narrative placing Arabic philosophy squarely within the twelfth and thirteenth century socio-political contexts of the Islamic world. It also proceeds to identify other important philosophical figures, not studied in this volume, both from this period and later, who continued working in one of several traditions that emerged during this second formative period. The volume also contains a General Index and an Index of Manuscripts; however, the latter would have been much more helpful had it also identified the authors and titles of the works, rather than solely the location of the physical manuscript.

Overall, the essays are not organized in any compelling fashion. Essays that examine the works of the same philosopher are found next to one another, but there is very little to suggest why essays on certain thinkers appear earlier than others, e.g., why Averroes before Ibn Ṭufayl or al-Suhrawardi before Averroes. Nonetheless, the placement of the first essay, Dimitri Gutas's "Philosophy in the Twelfth Century: One View from Baghdad, or the Repudiation of al-Ghazālī," is spot on. Using 'Abd al-Laṭīf al-Baghdādī's (d. 1231) autobiography, Gutas shows just how wrong the traditional view that philosophy was excluded from the madrasas due to religious opposition really is. Instead, through the eyes of this critic of Avicenna and al-Ghazālī, we see that logic and Avicennian philosophy were studied widely in madrasa circles by jurists, theologians and even grammarians. 'Abd al-Laṭīf documents for us the enormous success of Avicennian philosophy, as well as the important role played by al-Ghazālī in developing a philosophical theology based on Avicenna that gained a foothold amongst religious scholars of this period. The essay is thus the ideal set up for the overall goals of this volume.

The second essay, "'Abd al-Laṭīf al-Baghd­ādī as a Philosopher and a Physician: Myth or Reality, Topos or Truth?" by N. Peter Joosse, engages in a polemic with some modern scholars who have identified this figure as a leading philosopher-physician. Using medieval biographical dictionaries, Joosse shows that 'Abd al-Laṭīf was primarily a jurist and grammarian who was active in philosophical circles, and through his participation in philosophy engaged in theoretical medical debates without being a practicing physician per se.

The next three essays take us back to the first half of this period. Frank Griffel's "Between al-Ghazālī and Abū l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī: The Dialectical Turn in the Philosophy of Iraq and Iran During the Sixth/Twelfth Century" is a solid essay that shows how the traditions of falsafa (the philosophical tradition stemming from Aristotle and his Hellenistic and Islamic commentators) and kalām (a dialectical philosophical-theological tradition with its roots in the early Muslim schisms) came together in this period. Griffel argues that both kalām critiques of Avicennian falsafa, as found in al-Ghazālī's classic Tahāfut al-Falāsifa (Incoherence of the Philosophers), and critiques of Avicenna independent of the concerns of kalām, as found in Abū l-Barakāt's works, led to a gradual rejection of the Aristotelian view of philosophy as a demonstrative science based on apodictic arguments. Instead, philosophy came to be seen "as a dialectical field where the best available explanations are compared with one another" (p. 48). The dialectical turn gave rise to compendia, such as those of Abū l-Barakāt, that were no longer committed to a single tradition and even conceded that explanations stemming from different traditions may be mutually compatible.

Ayman Shihadeh's "New Light on the Reception of al-Ghazālī's Doctrines of the Philosophers (Maqāṣid al-Falāsifa)", uses the discovery of a new manuscript of al-Ghazālī's work to address the modern debate over al-Ghazālī's intentions behind writing it, its relationship to the Tahāfut, and its reception in both the Islamic and Latin world. Shihadeh concludes that even though the Maqāṣid's role in Islamic societies was marginal, since Avicenna himself was taught in madrasas and by the end of the twelfth century the philosophical theology found in Ashcarī kalām works was itself far more sophisticated than that of the Maqāṣid, nevertheless some circles of philosophers opposed to al-Ghazālī's project felt that an appropriately edited version of the text could still serve as a useful introduction to Avicennian thought, much as it did in the Latin West.

Sylvie Nony's "La dynamique d'Abū l-Barakāt: faire le vide pour penser le changement du changement" epitomizes Griffel's point that the new philosophical compendia were not tied to a specific tradition. Nony shows that Abū l-Barakāt uses John Philoponus's critique of Aristotelian space to arrive at a more mathematical conception, which in turn enables him to modify Avicenna's concept of impetus from it being the cause of the motion of a projectile to impetus being the cause of the change in motion of a projectile.

The next five essays are probably the most philosophical in the volume. In "'Knowledge by Presence', Apperception and the Mind-Body Relationship: Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī and al-Suhrawardī as Representatives of a Thirteenth Century Discussion," Heidrun Eichner fabulously navigates the difficult terrain of Avicennian epistemology in the twelfth century to shed light on the peculiarities of al-Suhrawardī's illuminationist philosophy. Eichner shows how al-Suhrawardī's particular understanding of "knowledge by presence" is grounded in the tensions present in the Avicennian corpus with regards to apperception, perception and sensation which were being worked out by twelfth century philosophers such as al-Rāzī. Jari Kaukua's "I in the Light of God: Selfhood and Self-Awareness in Suhrawardī's Ḥikmat al-ishrāq" similarly argues that the Avicennian doctrine of self-awareness -- appropriately reworked to ground al-Suhrawardī's contention that God's knowledge is nothing like that of humans -- lies at the heart of al-Suhrawardī's illuminationist concept of incorporeal light.

Deborah Black's "Averroes on the Spirituality and Intentionality of Sensation" traces the evolution in Averroes's thinking on sensation from his early Epitomes to his later Long Commentaries on Aristotelian works. She shows that there is a tension in Averroes's thinking between the position that objects of sensation have a different mode of being (intentionality thesis) and the position that sensation requires a form of change distinct from changes that occur in the physical realm (spirituality thesis). She argues that in working out the implication of these theses, to which he was firmly committed throughout his intellectual career, Averroes was led to the position that caused much difficulty for his Latin followers: the need for an agent sense that, like the agent intellect but distinct from it, actualizes the received forms of sensation as particulars in the sense organs. Matteo Di Giovanni's essay, "Substantial Form in Averroes's Long Commentary on the Metaphysics," similarly shows Averroes's strong commitment to a specifically holistic understanding of form and matter, which emerges out of the logical works of Aristotle and is an organic element of Averroes's entire metaphysical thinking.

Taneli Kukkonen's "Heart, Spirit, Form, Substance: Ibn Ṭufayl's Psychology," argues that the crux of Ibn Ṭufayl's tale lies in its philosophical psychology and not in showing how one can arrive at an understanding of the supernal realm, as is traditionally assumed. Kukkonen concludes that Ibn Ṭufayl's psychology was not "particularly original", but rather based on Avicenna's "superior efforts" to systematize Greek learning on this topic, with an eclectic mix of speculations borrowed from "either al-Fārābī or al-Ghazālī" (p. 213). This judgment though is a bit harsh; it is a consequence of Kukkonen’s not placing Ibn Ṭufayl properly in a mystical context and not recognizing the undetermined nature of Aristotelian psychology which allowed Ibn Ṭufayl to posit that the soul ("the spirit that is God's") is the form of the material spirit which resides in the heart and as such the locus of mystical insight.

In "Jewish Philosophy on the Eve of the Age of Averroism: Ibn Daud's Necessary Existent and His Use of Avicennian Science," Resianne Fontaine and Steven Harvey show how Ibn Daud uses Avicennian philosophy to resolve the theological problem of free will and counter what he deemed to be the faulty philosophy of Ibn Gabirol. This marks an episode of the Jewish encounter with the Aristotelian system which preceded the works of Averroes.

The last two essays focus on specific individuals and look at the history of specific traditions more generally. Anna Akasoy uses biographical dictionaries and certain polemical works to gauge the medieval understanding of "What is Philosophical Sufism?" She concludes that though the polemicists appropriately describe these authors as bringing together some aspects of falsafa and Sufism together, "it is impossible to describe a coherent set of ideas or methods which characterize philosophical Sufism" (p. 248). The concluding essay, "Muctazilism in the Age of Averroes" by Gregor Schwarb, fittingly provides a survey of the vibrancy of Muctazilī thought amongst Sunnī, Shīite and Jewish thinkers in many parts of the Islamic world. Unfortunately, most of these works still remain in manuscript and are yet to be studied fully, emphasizing, as Adamson recognizes in the introduction, that we are still far from arriving at a full picture of the complexity and richness of philosophical thought in the post-classical Islamic world. Yet what should be abundantly clear from this volume, as well as other recent volumes such as Avicenna and His Legacy (2009), is that nothing could be farther from the truth than the classic assertion that "the twelfth century AD saw the demise of philosophy in Islam" (p. 1) -- a view that unfortunately still holds wide currency in Western academia and popular culture.