Incompatibilism's Allure: Principal Arguments for Incompatibilism

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Ishtiyaque Haji, Incompatibilism's Allure: Principal Arguments for Incompatibilism, Broadview Press, 2009, 224pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551119199.

Reviewed by Matt King, Carleton College


Every now and again, it is of great benefit to philosophers to sit down and review the progress that's been made in some area of debate. Doing so offers the promise of sorting out what old problems may have been solved, what new problems may have been discovered, and what connections between the disparate questions and disagreements might still be found. Ishtiyaque Haji's new book Incompatibilism's Allure is an attempt to critically assess the state of the art in arguments for the incompatibility of moral responsibility with determinism, the thesis that the past together with the laws of nature 'entail' all subsequent truths.

Haji traces an impressive path through four separate arguments for incompatibilism (the Consequence Argument, Direct Argument, Deontic Argument, and Manipulation Argument), while also discussing a fifth argument (the Impossibility Argument), for the conceptual impossibility of moral responsibility. This last argument doesn't rely in any way on determinism, and this brings us to my first, and quite minor, critique of the book. It can at times be puzzling why it is called Incompatibilism's Allure. While Haji finds some of the arguments (or their parts) more attractive than others, what he seems to be engaged in primarily is sorting through the arguments he takes to attract other thinkers to incompatibilism. Thus, the book's aim, given that it rejects the above arguments, is really an indirect defense of compatibilism. While Haji is a sympathetic evaluator, the book won't make a case for incompatibilism, but rather evaluate what he takes to be the principal motivating aims and arguments in its support. In light of this, compatibilists, or those with similar tendencies, may be a bit puzzled as to what the fuss is about.

The above is, as I said, a minor quibble, as the book is at least largely packaged as a resource, especially for teaching these arguments, and it succeeds quite nicely in this regard. The introductory chapter begins with some now familiar thought experiments intended to arouse incompatibilist intuitions. Haji continues with a short presentation of each of the main arguments he'll be investigating, noting each as a "pathway to incompatibilism" (19). By the end of the first chapter, the reader has been introduced to every significant topic in the remainder of the book and the main arguments of note have already been sketched. The subsequent chapters follow this roadmap, discussing each argument in turn and providing a helpful examination of how the debate about each can illuminate our understanding of the arguments that follow. Haji ably illustrates how, for example, objections to the Consequence Argument naturally lead to the deployment of the Direct Argument, proposed counterexamples to which, in virtue of relying on claims regarding the connection between obligation and avoidability, indicate the rationale behind the Deontic Argument. We thus get a sort of genealogy of incompatibilist argumentation, which, at least for me, increases appreciation for the connections between otherwise separate debates regarding determinism and responsibility. Those unfamiliar with these arguments will get a clear picture of both how the arguments work and the progression of the dialectic. Haji is forthcoming about when the details of a disagreement may begin to obscure the larger lessons, and notes where readers may wish to skip ahead. This helps to preserve the big picture, which is all too often lost in discussions of this scope.

Haji admits that not all of his discussion is original (25). There is an innovative counterexample to the Direct Argument focusing on the epistemic condition on responsibility, some original critiques against the Deontic Argument (drawing on his 2002 book, Deontic Morality and Control), and an extended treatment of the Manipulation Argument. In other cases, Haji is covering well-worn ground in rehearsing familiar objections and replies to well-known arguments. It would be otiose for me to provide further commentary on these debates. In these instances, where I disagree, the disagreement stems not from Haji's position or interpretation. Additionally, though I find myself critical of aspects of Haji's discussion of a number of the principal arguments, full discussion of such matters would extend far beyond my space limitations here. As each argument requires sufficient background and setup, we would soon risk losing sense of the book's overall impact and objective for more technical matters. Instead, I will limit my critical remarks to Haji's discussion of the Manipulation Argument. I do this for two reasons: First, it is, of all the principal arguments, one of the most recent in origin and perhaps the most hotly discussed currently. Second, Haji's discussion of it contains his most significant positive contribution in the book, his account of "authenticity."

Manipulation arguments have been of particular interest lately. Their structure typically fits the following schema (23):

(1) Present case C, which involves responsibility-undermining manipulation.

(2) Demonstrate that there is no relevant difference between actions that result from a deterministic causal history and C.

(3) If (1) and (2) are true, then determinism undermines moral responsibility.

(4) Therefore, determinism undermines moral responsibility.

The Manipulation Schema (MS) attempts to show that just as manipulation removes responsibility-relevant control, so too does determinism. The standard response strategies are to reject either premise 1 or premise 2. Haji follows Michael McKenna in calling the first strategy the "hard-line reply" and the second the "soft-line reply" (125). The hard-liner simply denies that the given case C is a case of undermined responsibility, instead arguing that the agent involved is in fact responsible. The soft-liner accepts the given case, but argues that there is a relevant difference between that case and ordinary action in a deterministic universe.

To better appreciate these strategies, it would be helpful to consider a particular case. One given by Alfred Mele (and used by Haji [14]) is:

Ann/Beth: Ann and Beth are both philosophy professors but Ann is far more dedicated to the discipline. Wanting more production out of Beth and not scrupulous about how he gets it, the dean of the University enlists the help of new-wave neurologists who "implant" Ann's hierarchy of values into easy-going Beth. The values are practically unsheddable, but not irresistible. The "induction" of values into Beth makes her the psychological twin of Ann in some respects, but leaves untouched many of Beth's other pre-manipulated values so that pre-manipulated is the same person as post-manipulated Beth.

Mele suggests (as others do) that because Beth's new values are the result of such manipulation, actions she performs as a result of those values, at least actions soon after the manipulation, are not ones for which Beth is responsible.

A hard-line reply to the Ann/Beth case would therefore claim that should Beth act from those new values, she would nonetheless be responsible for so acting. A soft-line reply would be to accept that Beth would not be responsible for such actions, but to reject the claim that determinism implies all our actions are like Beth's. Haji defends a soft-line reply, while objecting to hard-line replies. His position is that charity demands that we accept the first premise of a MS, and yet that an objection to premise 2 is in the offing once we settle on his favored compatibilist account of "authenticity": an account that specifies when an agent's "springs of action" are authentic. Such an account will distinguish properly, then, between post-manipulated Beth's actions and an ordinary agent's actions in a deterministic universe. I will suggest here first that Haji's rejecting of hard-line replies is under-motivated and second that his own soft-line reply appeals to the same elements of the hard-line reply that Haji previously objected to. I conclude that Haji hasn't given us a substantially different reply from hard-liners like McKenna. Finally, I'll draw a general lesson from considering MS.

All that's required for a hard-line reply is rejecting that the given case C is in fact an instance of non-responsibility. Hard-liners, as Haji notes, are inclined to say that the manipulation in cases like Beth's is benign (127-128). Since their favored compatibilist conditions on responsibility are still satisfied by Beth when she acts, it follows from their views that she is responsible. How Beth acquired her attitudes is inconsequential, the hard-liner claims. What matters is that she exercises compatibilist control over her actions. If she does, then she's responsible. The hard-liner thus adopts what we may call an ahistorical view: the conditions under which one's attitudes are acquired are irrelevant to one's responsibility for particular actions performed because of those attitudes.

Haji argues that charity of interpretation requires the compatibilist to take case C seriously. If the given case doesn't involve responsibility-undermining manipulation on one's view, Haji recommends amending the example so that it does. He notes that all compatibilists must admit that there are cases of "menacing" manipulation. So if Beth's manipulation doesn't fit the bill, he advises that the compatibilist understand Beth's case "as featuring manipulation which, given your compatibilist account of control, you think is menacing" (131). If dialectical charity requires that the compatibilist is to ensure that case C involves responsibility-undermining manipulation (by that compatibilist's own lights), then a soft-line reply is the only one available. The compatibilist is forced by principles of charity to grant premise 1 of MS.

This objection strikes me as under-motivated. Consider some compatibilist set of conditions CC for responsibility. If the compatibilist is required to interpret Beth's manipulation so that she fails to satisfy CC when acting, then of course she isn't responsible. But Haji interprets the challenge set by MS to lie in a difficulty distinguishing between manipulated agents who fail CC and agents performing ordinary actions in a deterministic universe. It seems obvious that there can be such a difference. For if the compatibilist is inclined to distinguish menacing manipulation from benign instances by applying CC, then the difference between a menacingly-manipulated agent and ordinary agents in a deterministic universe is that the latter can still satisfy CC. The above reasoning is presumably a simple explanation of why particular hard-liners are hard-liners. If, according to them, Beth satisfies CC, then she is responsible. If we construe Beth's case so that she violates CC, then, of course, she is no longer responsible for her action. But then it appears that the compatibilist is under no pressure to suppose that those manipulation cases could ever generalize to support incompatibilism. For the cases in question, even on Haji's recommendation, would be just those that violate CC, but since CC are compatibilist conditions, their satisfaction is ex hypothesi possible even in a deterministic universe. So while I can grant that proponents of MS intend for the cases of manipulation to be menacing, if we distinguish such manipulation by applying CC, then MS doesn't get off the ground.

In addition, I'm not sure whether Haji's soft-line reply fares any better dialectically than the hard-line reply. There isn't space here to give a full accounting of Haji's view, but his basic claim is that the implanted attitudes on which manipulated agents act are "inauthentic" (143). He grants that Beth isn't responsible for what she does, but he also rejects premise 2 of MS by claiming that ordinary agents can have authentic attitudes.

Why are Beth's attitudes inauthentic? Haji claims that an attitude is inauthentic if that attitude or "the way in which it is acquired subverts moral responsibility for behavior" which causally stems from this attitude (151). But this implies that what explains the inauthenticity of Beth's attitudes is the fact that her actions on the basis of those attitudes would not be ones for which she is responsible.

This response is puzzling. We have proponents of MS who think that Beth's non-responsibility generalizes in support of incompatibilism. Hard-liners disagree because Beth is responsible since she satisfies CC, or else, when the manipulation is menacing (because it violates CC), it will never generalize. Haji also disagrees. He thinks that Beth's attitudes are inauthentic (because their acquisition bypassed her deliberative control), which he takes to be explained by the fact that Beth isn't responsible for her post-manipulated action. Haji also claims that for ordinary agents, their acquisition or modification of attitudes typically doesn't bypass their deliberative control, so such acquisition is authentic. But it can only be authentic, it seems, if it's the case that such agents would be responsible for actions that causally stem from those attitudes. For authenticity is seemingly defined in terms of responsibility for later action.

It seems to me that Haji's strategy begs the question against the proponent of MS that the manipulation involved doesn't generalize. What distinguishes Beth from ordinary agents in a deterministic universe is that only ordinary agents can have authentic attitudes. But this fact is explained in terms of ordinary agents being morally responsible for (at least some of) what they do. This, however, hasn't distinguished between the cases in a way fair to the incompatibilist. For the incompatibilist isn't under any pressure to claim that ordinary agents are responsible for what they do, and if she rejects this claim, she can reject that ordinary agents have authentic attitudes (in Haji's sense). From this perspective, the hard-line reply appears to be at least as charitable a compatibilist strategy, since it doesn't seem to beg any questions.

The lesson to be drawn, I think, is that debate over MS is unlikely to be a profitable interaction between compatibilists and incompatibilists. Chances are that even sympathetic commentators will end up in what John Martin Fischer has called "dialectical stalemates". Incompatibilists cannot assume against the compatibilist that case C involves responsibility-undermining manipulation; nor can compatibilists assume against the incompatibilist that manipulated agents who satisfy CC are thus responsible. If the manipulated agent fails CC, then generalization will be necessarily blocked, for meeting CC is compatible with determinism, ex hypothesi. And incompatibilists will be no more inclined to accept this reply to MS than they are to accept CC in general.

I think Haji falls victim to just such a stalemate, but this is small criticism. As I noted earlier, compatibilists, even reflective ones, may have a hard time seeing the "allure" of incompatibilism that Haji attempts to evaluate in this book. His efforts are admirable; progress on these fronts may require such sincerity. And despite my criticisms here, Incompatibilism's Allure remains an impressive volume, a worthwhile critical examination of the principal arguments for the incompatibility of moral responsibility and determinism.