Individuality and Beyond: Nietzsche Reads Emerson

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Benedetta Zavatta, Individuality and Beyond: Nietzsche Reads Emerson, Alexander Reynolds (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2019, 265pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190929213.

Reviewed by Andrew Huddleston, Birkbeck College, University of London


In an 1883 letter to his friend Franz Overbeck, Nietzsche, in a rhapsodic register, writes that he feels Ralph Waldo Emerson to be a kindred spirit, a "brother soul" [Bruder-Seele] (187), as Nietzsche puts it. Nietzsche encountered Emerson's essays as a schoolboy, and he continued engaging with them well into his active philosophical years. This affinity between Nietzsche and Emerson has long been noted. In his 1974 translation of Nietzsche's Gay Science, Walter Kaufmann devotes a full section of his introduction to this topic and reports that the first edition of the text carried an epigraph from Emerson. While noting some points of similarity between Nietzsche and Emerson, he says that "the differences are far more striking" than the affinities.[1]

In literature of the past several decades, there have been some treatments of this topic, and attempts to establish further points of similarity between the two thinkers. Stanley Cavell and James Conant have, for example, proposed Emerson-inspired readings of Nietzsche's perfectionism, particularly in connection with Nietzsche's essay "Schopenhauer as Educator" in the Untimely Meditations.[2] And studies by George Stack and David Mikics have explored the Nietzsche-Emerson connection further in book-length monographs.[3]

Benedetta Zavatta's book is in the same direction, but is notable, indeed ground-breaking, for its level of philological detail. She looks to Nietzsche's personal library, housed at the Duchess Anna Amalia Bibliothek in Weimar, for the marginalia in his copies of Emerson to get an indication of what he read, what he underlined, where he indicated agreement, disagreement, and the like. As Nietzsche did not read English, he engaged, in the case of several of Emerson's most famous essays, with the German 1858 translation by Fabricius. In one case, Nietzsche apparently even got a translation into English of Emerson's introduction to The Uses of Great Men, thanks to the work of his friend Overbeck's wife Ida (186-7). In light of these translation issues, Zavatta looks to places where the English and the German interestingly diverge, and considers how this might make a difference to Nietzsche's understanding of Emerson. For instance, Emerson's famous remark in "Self-Reliance" that "imitation is suicide" is mistranslated in Fabricius's German, with "suicide" rendered as "Meuchelmord" [treacherous murder/ assassination] instead of "Selbstmord" (79). It is then this mistaken formulation that is copied in Nietzsche's 1882 note on this passage.[4] When it comes to documenting Nietzsche's reading and engagement with Emerson, the scholarship on display here is exemplary and highly informative in just this way. Zavatta is generally cautious not to over-egg the affinities, and does a good job pointing out the points of divergence as well as the agreements between Nietzsche and Emerson.

Zavatta combs through Nietzsche's correspondence, and she also, as just indicated in the example above, draws on Nietzsche's extensive notebook entries from this period. She reminds us (probably familiar to Nietzsche scholars, but bearing repeated emphasis) that Nietzsche had a note-taking practice of transcribing whole passages of things that he was reading (including Emerson) directly into his notebooks. This habit of Nietzsche's should furnish a reminder, for the more zealous and incautious among the Nachlaß-citers, that Nietzsche's notebooks are precisely that, places where he is writing down notes, including a mixture of things, some of which he himself thinks, some of which he is toying with, and some of which he's simply read and copied out, with which he may or may not agree. His notebooks are not unpublished books of his ideas, and they should not be treated as such -- a warning that alas often goes unheeded.

For those primarily familiar with Nietzsche, and with only more passing or faded acquaintance with Emerson, this study yields important insights. Emerson is often associated with democracy and egalitarianism, along with the more familiar Emersonian themes of personal authenticity and individualism in evidence in "Self-Reliance" and elsewhere. In some sense that democratic-egalitarian picture of Emerson is right. Yet as Zavatta tells us, Emerson was, like many 19th century thinkers -- including John Stuart Mill and, to a fever pitch, Nietzsche himself -- deeply concerned about the consequences of mass culture and political enfranchisement related to it. In The Conduct of Life, Emerson writes, in terms so contemptuous and patronizing it sounds as though it could be from the lips of Nietzsche: "Masses are rude, lame, unmade, pernicious in their demands and influence, and need not to be flattered but to be schooled. I wish not to concede anything to them, but to tame, drill, divide, and break them up, and draw individuals of out them" (quoted in Zavatta, 153). Emerson continues: "honest men only, lovely, sweet, accomplished women only, and no shovel-handed, narrow-brained, gin-drinking million stockingers or lazzaroni at all."[5]

It is that theme of genuine individuality, nurturing its emergence and ensuring its flourishing, on which Zavatta trains the greatest philosophical attention. Of the various potential Nietzsches on offer in the recent Nietzsche literature, the Nietzsche who emerges in Zavatta's book is what we might loosely-speaking call the 'existentialist' Nietzsche, with the associated familiar exhortations to 'be yourself,' to 'create your own values,' to 'resist herd conformity,' and the like. Given the concern with Emerson, these sorts of themes get centrality in this study. So too, it is on the texts from the mid 1870s to earlier 1880s that Zavatta tends to focus; the Untimely Meditations, Human, All Too Human, Daybreak, The Gay Science, and Thus Spoke Zarathustra appear to get the most references, with comparatively little discussion of Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morality.

Zavatta's book comprises five main chapters. The first concerns the reception history of the Nietzsche-Emerson relation and is filled with pertinent information. The subsequent 4 chapters are titled in such a way as to suggest a demarcation into major topics within Nietzsche's philosophy: Chapter 2 is about freedom and fate, Chapter 3 concerns the place of autonomous individuality in Nietzsche's ethics and critique of morality, Chapter 4 focuses on the relation between the individual and the wider society, and Chapter 5 treats Nietzsche's views on the uses of history. What actually transpires in these chapters ends up being more various, to the point that these chapter headings sometimes became a bit mystifying, particularly Chapter 5, where, for example, material about perfectionism in "Schopenhauer as Educator" was treated under the heading of "Making History and Writing History."

After the preliminary chapter, each of the main chapters works toward showing the relation of Emerson's ideas to Nietzsche's ideas. In Chapter 3 Zavatta proposes an Emerson-inspired formalist and individualist model of ethics, focused "not on the content but rather the form of the values in question," whether they are values that express one's individual self (75). In places, Zavatta takes Nietzsche and Emerson to diverge in important ways. Thus, for instance, in Chapter 2 Zavatta argues that whereas Emerson thinks each individual has a "unique and unrepeatable nature of his or her own" (65), Nietzsche maintains that our personality is not just partly malleable, but wholly changeable, "susceptible of being altered in every single one of its various component aspects and elements" (65), and moreover, that Nietzsche takes us to have a form of freedom insofar as we act "with deliberation" and in ways we have "decided upon autonomously" (66). These are controversial interpretive claims to be making, and seemed to me to require greater exegetical defense and philosophical elaboration than they were given here.

The book is on secure footing in relating what Nietzsche was reading and what notes and letters he wrote about that reading. When it moves into the attribution of philosophical positions to Nietzsche, it is at times less persuasive.

There is a certain caricature of Nietzsche scholarship, as now practiced in continental Europe and the Anglophone world respectively, which goes like this: Much of the best Nietzsche scholarship in continental Europe is philologically rich and informed, in the way that the best parts of Zavatta's book are. In the Anglophone sphere, much of the best scholarship is, by contrast, focused on the careful reconstruction of the philosophical positions themselves, and thinking about the finer details of those positions. The former approach is sometimes accused of being long on the philology, and short on the philosophy. The latter approach is accused of lacking due care for the context of the text, or indeed, for the detail of the texts themselves. As with many caricatures, this is accurate in certain ways and inaccurate in others. Zavatta's book tries, in an admirable way, to bridge this divide in scholarly practice by using findings about Nietzsche's reading of Emerson to shed light on issues of important debate within Nietzsche interpretation. This project of the book, to my mind, met with varying degrees of success, however.

The best parts of the book were those where these two endeavors, philological and expository-reconstructive, helped us see the philosophical issues and the interpretive possibilities in a different light. Some of the high points, to my mind, were Zavatta's discussion of different forms of egoism and her treatment of various ethical and psychological issues surrounding compassion and envy. The book was also good on some issues which tend to get somewhat less attention in the mainstream of Nietzsche studies -- Nietzsche on friendship, for instance, and Nietzsche on solitude. There is much of interest here.

In other places, though, the book was not as satisfying when it came to the enunciation and clarification of Nietzsche's views. I sometimes felt that the views weren't being explored in a philosophically fine-grained and textually-sensitive way, and at times this proved rather frustrating. Ironically, for a book with such abundantly-detailed analysis of Nietzsche's sources and notes, I sometimes wanted more of this close reading of Nietzsche's own philosophical text and more careful consideration of how that text bears on the attribution of views to him.

For instance, I had hoped that the book's concern with Emerson would shed further light on lingering exegetical issues in the treatment of the "Schopenhauer as Educator" essay from the Untimely Meditations, which has been the subject of considerable interpretive controversy concerning whether Nietzsche is as elitist as it often appears. Section 6 of this essay in particular has become a focal point of debate. John Rawls in A Theory of Justice cites this passage in attributing a form of inegalitarian perfectionism to Nietzsche (which of course Rawls will then argue against), and a similar reading of Nietzsche has been elaborated in more detail by Thomas Hurka.[6] In contrast to these more inegalitarian readings, Cavell and Conant have read this text differently, emphasizing Nietzsche's more Emersonian call to self-transformation.[7] There is a grain of truth in both schools of thought, I think, and tricky interpretive issues to navigate in this subtle text. A number of others have weighed in on this debate, and Zavatta does so as well, preferring the Emersonian line (173-8). But her discussion was sometimes wanting, I found. For instance, "Schopenhauer as Educator" seems to suggest, inconveniently for the Emersonian reading, that most people achieve their calling precisely by sacrificing themselves to serve the genius of the few (§6). Zavatta dismisses this politically-unpalatable reading, but without any real argument and without offering a reading of the relevant glaring bits of Nietzsche's text that are in tension with her preferred interpretation. The deeper question for Zavatta's overall reading is whether the sort of exemplary individuality Nietzsche lauds, as she sees it following Emerson, is something that he thinks is open to everyone to achieve, and is ideally to be pursued by everyone. An Emersonian presumably would be more optimistic and positive on these fronts. But is Nietzsche? Zavatta suggests that, but does not, to my mind, make a convincing case for this interpretation, all the more so if she means this to characterize the view we find in his later works, such as Beyond Good and Evil.

Other positions that Zavatta attributed to Nietzsche raised eyebrows as well. At one point Zavatta says: "Nietzsche's 'will to power' is conceived of as the very structure of all that exists" (74). In fairness, this is not an interpretive claim central to Zavatta's main case. My main quibble, to be clear, is not that the claim is philosophically implausible (though I think it is), but rather: what is the textual basis for attributing this ambitious metaphysical hypothesis to Nietzsche? Bits of the Nachlaß are the only thing cited by Zavatta in the endnotes, albeit without any indication of where, if at all, she thinks these ideas might be repeated in the published work. Does Zavatta think that it is good exegetical practice to attribute claims to Nietzsche simply based on the Nachlaß alone? I suppose if one just cares about the philosophical ideas themselves, rather than their provenance, this approach might be in order. But it sits somewhat uncomfortably with the cautious and scholarly philological spirit of Zavatta's enterprise as a whole. In any event, there is -- so far as I can tell, and as I think Maudemarie Clark has persuasively shown -- no good textual basis for thinking that this strong metaphysical claim about the 'will to power' is endorsed in Nietzsche's published works.[8] Clark mounts this case by looking very closely at Nietzsche's actual wording in key passages, especially Beyond Good and Evil, §36. When it comes to the philosophical details of positions attributed to Nietzsche, this is the sort of close reading we should be doing and the sort of debate we should be having. One might disagree with the Clark interpretation, but it really should be engaged with, if one is to make interpretive claims of this sort. It is a main point of reference on this issue, and many other issues, and it is not cited.

There were several examples like this where there was an odd mismatch between extremely careful research and detail about what reading might underlie Nietzsche's ideas, but less care in the precise formulation of these ideas themselves, and less care in attribution of these positions to Nietzsche warranted by a weighing of the textual evidence for and against, in triangulation with secondary literature. Such scrupulousness should be all the more important on this crucial philosophical front. Interpretive possibilities must be stated and differentiated with rigorous analytical sophistication, and a persuasive argument must be made that Nietzsche's own text points to one as opposed to another (or, as is often the case with Nietzsche, that it leaves open several options). This, one must stress, is not a complaint about a failure to extend "charity" to Nietzsche in reconstructing what he says, or doubts about the philosophical plausibility of what he is purported to be claiming. It is instead a matter of making a solid, well-defended interpretive case that he's actually to be read as saying what one claims he's saying. This, it seems to me, should always be paramount, however illuminating the details of his intellectual influences and context might be as well.

But that concern may well betray my own methodological bias, and one cannot be expected to cover all fronts equally. We should be ecumenical -- far more so than we tend to be in the philosophical Anglosphere -- in welcoming both the more philological and the more reconstructive endeavors in Nietzsche studies, and particularly, work like this that seeks to encompass both approaches, and often succeeds ably in that endeavor. Zavatta has done a fine service to Nietzsche scholars by giving them a learned, well-documented treatment of Emerson's influence on Nietzsche. Zavatta's research is enriching, and I commend her work to others interested in this connection, and those interested in Nietzsche generally.

[1] Walter Kaufmann, "Introduction" to The Gay Science, (Vintage Books, 1974), p. 11.

[2] Stanley Cavell, Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism (University of Chicago Press, 1990); James Conant, "Nietzsche's Perfectionism: A Reading of Schopenhauer as Educator," in Nietzsche's Postmoralism, ed. Richard Schacht, (Cambridge University Press, 2001), pp. 181-257.

[3] George Stack, Nietzsche and Emerson: An Elective Affinity (Ohio University Press, 1992); David Mikics, The Romance of Individualism in Emerson and Nietzsche (Ohio University Press, 2003).

[4] NL 1882 17 [22]

[5] The Conduct of Life, reprinted in Emerson: Essays and Lectures (Library of America, 1983), p. 1081.

[6] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1971); Thomas Hurka, "Nietzsche: Perfectionist" in Nietzsche and Morality, eds. Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (Oxford University Press, 2007).

[7] Cavell, Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism; Conant, "Nietzsche's Perfectionism: A Reading of Schopenhauer as Educator," pp. 181-257.

[8] Maudemarie Clark, Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1990), esp. pp. 212-18.