Integral Pluralism: Beyond Culture Wars

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Fred Dallmayr, Integral Pluralism: Beyond Culture Wars, University of Kentucky Press, 2010, 231pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780813125718.

Reviewed by Kenneth W. Stikkers, Southern Illinois University, Carbondale


In his most recent volume, Integral Pluralism: Beyond Culture Wars, Fred Dallmayr again demonstrates, as he has throughout his distinguished career, his passionate commitment to making ours a more just and peaceful world. His central concern in this work is that, with postmodernism's steady move toward pluralism and emphatic rejection of totalizing monisms of every sort, there is a danger of cosmic incoherence whereby "individual lives likewise become incoherent and unintelligible" (1) and rendered incapable of effective engagement in the world. Dallmayr warns us:

Pluralism harbors a danger that curiously approximates it again to the monistic temptation. Carried to the extreme of radical fragmentation or dispersal, pluralism -- despite its protestations -- shades over into an assembly of fixed and self-enclosed monadic units exhibiting the same monadic units exhibiting the same static quality as its counterpart (8-9).

Such fragmentation, he further suggests, is a major source for today's "culture wars."

As an antidote to radical, atomizing pluralism, and as a middle position between it and tyrannizing monism, Dallmayr offers "integral pluralism," which he finds well exemplified already by classical pragmatists such as John Dewey, but especially by William James in A Pluralistic Universe. Integral pluralism entails "mutual embroilment, interpenetration, and contestation … differential entwinement without fusion or segregation" (9). The universe is taken as incomplete, but its pieces maintain real, although sometimes antagonistic, relations to one another. Other, non-Western thinkers whom Dallmayr offers as exemplars of integral pluralism are the philosopher of religion, Raimon Panikkar, whom Dallmayr discusses throughout this volume (and with whom this reviewer was privileged to study), Mahatma Gandhi, who receives a full chapter (Chapter 7), and two other, recently deceased Indian thinkers, little known in the West, Daya Krishna and Ramchandra Gandhi (a grandson of Mahatma Gandhi), who are the central subjects of the concluding chapter (Chapter 8). This reviewer is very appreciative of being made aware of these last two thinkers, and Dallmayr's interesting account of them has prompted him to read them first-hand.

Moreover, each of the above figures, including Dewey, is used to demonstrate the importance of religion for integrative pluralism. The Indian thinkers are especially exemplary because they articulate religious sensibilities that are integrated with the secular, in contrast to Western tendencies toward dualism, and thus steer between the dangers stemming from such dualism, namely, the politicizing of religion on the one hand (e.g., America's religious right and Islamic and Zionist extremisms), and the privatizing of religion and withdrawal into the solitude of religious consciousness, on the other.

Dallmayr offers brief references to Lyotard and Rorty to illustrate his concern about the danger of radical pluralisms, but they seem insufficient in persuasively demonstrating that his concern is a real rather than merely an imagined one or that he is attacking anything other than a strawman. Where do we actually see pluralism devolving into such atomism and causing the dire consequences he fears? "Pluralism" enjoys such a variety of meanings presently: a more nuanced discussion of its varieties at the start might have aided Dallmayr's analysis. In some contexts "pluralism" is merely descriptive of the fact that inquiry is concretely situated in the world, that we all think from somewhere, rather than from nowhere, that we are not placeless cogitos, that the starting points for inquiry are as numerous as thinkers, and that although we might usefully, but cautiously and provisionally, cluster such starting points, in terms such as race, gender, and class, there ultimately is no singular, privileged or God's-eye view from which inquiry begins. Pluralism understood descriptively in this way is thus the opponent of any sort of apriorism that imperialistically aims to secure a proper or "objective" perspective in advance of inquiry.

"Pluralism," however, also has normative meanings: normative pluralism, or what I have termed "cultivated pluralism,"[1] argues for the need to preserve plurality. Classical pragmatists, such as Peirce, James, and Dewey, are at least descriptive pluralists, but they also see the plurality of perspectives from which inquiry begins as a primary source of "irritation" (Peirce) and one of the factors that generates socially "problematic situations" (Dewey). The aim of inquiry, then, is to arrive at "truth" and thereby forge a common perspective as the alternative to violence. As Peirce describes, inquiry aims to "grind off" individuality and plurality. New perspectives, however, continuously emerge, and thus plurality remains an ineradicable feature of our world, despite even the most violent efforts toward uniformity. There are, however, at least for Dewey but especially for Alain Locke, good reasons to preserve and even cultivate plurality in the face of inquiry's tendency toward monism. For Dewey, the reasons are largely aesthetic: variety is the spice of life. For Locke, cultivated pluralism deepens the quality of inquiry by serving as a safeguard against a consensus that comes too quickly and easily. Locke's cosmopolitanism derives mainly from his study under Josiah Royce and his participation in the Baha'i faith, and I strongly recommend him as an important resource for Dallmayr and those interested in his project.

Dallmayr equivocates between descriptive and normative meanings of "pluralism," and it is not evident that he is a pluralist in the normative sense: he offers no clear arguments for the active preservation, cultivation, and celebration of plurality but only for its tolerance and against imperialistic monisms. "Integral pluralism" thus appears to be more a program for peaceful, democratic consensus-forming -- a noble goal, to be sure -- than it is one for the cultivation and celebration of difference. With James, Dallmayr holds that (descriptively) there is likely never to be an "all-form" to encase the whole of life, but it is not evident that such an ontological fact is a good thing for him. Indeed, like Carl Schmitt, whom he discusses extensively and critically (especially in Chapters 2 and 3), Dallmayr seems more impressed by society's need for decision-making than he is by the need for and goodness of plurality.

Indeed, a secondary concern that seems to motivate Dallmayr's study is the recent popular, uncritical appropriation of Schmitt, especially in France, and the infiltration of his ideas into the thinking especially of those on the political right, including George W. Bush. Dallmayr seems sympathetic, as is this reviewer, to the basic premise of Schmitt's "political theology," namely, that "All significant concepts of the modern theory of the state are secularized theological concepts" (Schmitt, as quoted on p. 45), and seems to share Schmitt's concern (which this reviewer does not) that pluralism, at least of the non-integral sort, risks undermining society's ability to act decisively.

Dallmayr, however, finds Schmitt overly simplistic on at least two major points (and this reviewer concurs). First, Schmitt asserts that the notions of "the political" and, hence, the "State" rest upon a Manichean divide between "friend" and "enemy." Not only is such a dichotomy not self-evident, as Schmitt takes it to be, but it is also quickly contradicted by a whole host of historical examples, e.g., Aristotle's conception of politics as a quest for the common good (24). Second, Schmitt reduces all religion to the imperialistic form, envisaging "God" only as the omnipotent tyrant. Dallmayr counters this gross over-simplification by reminding us, especially in Chapter 5, of the "suffering servant" tradition in Christianity -- "God on a donkey," rather than as almighty and on-high -- and by pointing to Eastern religious traditions, particularly those of India. Here, Panikkar's vast work in comparative religion is especially effective for Dallmayr's analysis.

Very impressive is Dallmayr's broad familiarity with diverse figures from both Western and Eastern traditions and the provocative ways in which he brings them into dialogue with one another. This large cast of characters and the East-West dialogue that Dallmayr creates through them, are, on the one hand, great strengths of the book and make his a very rich study, but they are also, however, sources of concern, as Dallmayr acknowledges differences among these thinkers and traditions but then goes on to minimize or even to ignore these, often important, differences. Especially striking to this reviewer is his effort to connect almost seamlessly Hans-Georg Gadamer's hermeneutical theory and Maurice Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of enfleshed intersubjectivity, seeing them, along with Dewey and Charles Taylor, solely as allies against "hegemony, exploitation, and oppression" (122). Such seems an over-simplification.

Gadamer and Merleau-Ponty are offered, in Chapter 6, as two Western examples of "integral pluralism in action." Indeed, Dallmayr writes this book in part to commemorate Merleau-Ponty's one-hundredth birthday. His articulation of Gadamerian hermeneutics, however, provides evidence in support of criticisms that I[2] and others, such as John Caputo[3] (whom Dallmayr cites favorably in his articulation of "a religion of service"), have made of Gadamerian hermeneutics, namely, that a pervasive conservative essentialism underlies it. Such essentialism is seen in Dallmayr's repeated description of Gadamerian hermeneutics as a "discovery," rather than a making or creation, of the meaning of texts, or whatever is the object of interpretation, and in the manner that "tradition" is taken as already constituted in advance of interpretation, within the fore-structure of experience, rather than as emergent from or created through the interpretative act itself, as I take it to be in Peircean semiotics, Roycean hermeneutics, and Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of embodied intersubjectivity.

Indeed, Dallmayr seems to miss how some of the very passages that he quotes from Merleau-Ponty stand in stark contrast to Gadamer's essentialism. Gadamer's "fusion of horizons" is a far cry from Schmitt's friend-enemy dichotomy, to be sure, but it nonetheless presupposes self and other, tradition and the foreign as already constituted polarities, awaiting the fusion that interpretation will bring. Such stands in sharp contrast to Merleau-Ponty's rich account of how self and other emerge out of "the flesh of the world" through embodied communication: "I give birth … this other is made from my flesh and blood and yet is no longer me," as Dallmayr quotes Merleau-Ponty (120). This is but one example of how Dallmayr glosses over stark differences among thinkers in his eagerness to unite them within the cause of integral pluralism.

Given Dallmayr's especial affinity for American pragmatism, I highly recommend three resources based in that tradition who, I believe, offer hermeneutical theories that serve his project better than does Gadamer's. First is the Cologne constructivist school, which, grounded in Deweyan philosophy but also incorporating the best insights from German thinkers such as Gadamer and Habermas, is taking on concrete issues, especially in education, stemming from the growing pluralization of German society due to immigration.[4] Second is the pragmatist theory of literary interpretation and criticism developed by the late student and colleague of Dewey, Louise Rosenblatt.[5] Her use of Dewey's distinction between "interaction" and "transaction" does much to avoid the essentialism that plagues Gadamer's philosophy.

Third is the work of Jane Addams on the importance of listening in a pluralistic society, which is getting significant attention, and rightfully so, among pragmatist scholars.[6] Gadamer, too, offers valuable insights into the importance of listening for hermeneutics, but Dallmayr neglects those insights in his discussion of Gadamer and overlooks the importance of listening generally in his discussion of the sorts of communication that are necessary for integral pluralism. I believe that he would find Addams especially valuable because she develops her theory of listening out of her rich, concrete experiences of cultural diversity in the settlement house and her efforts there to bring together immigrants from diverse ethnic backgrounds -- often with long histories of hostility toward one another -- for common purposes, such as better sanitation, health services, working conditions, and education. Moreover, Addams, like (Alain) Locke, celebrates diversity while at the same time coping with its messiness. Dallmayr well notes, in concluding his discussion of Merleau-Ponty, how the French phenomenologist offers integral pluralism a form of communication which is more than a mere sharing of ideas "but a 'community of doing' … a sharing of practices, which includes a willingness to learn about unfamiliar practices, rituals, rites, and customs," which "in turn, involves a form of existential participation or engagement -- a participation in past memories, present agonies, and future hopes and aspirations" (122). I can think of no philosopher who better exemplifies what Dallmayr so nicely describes than Jane Addams.[7]

Despite the concerns expressed above, this recent work by Fred Dallmayr is a highly valuable contribution to the ever-expanding discussion on pluralism and essential reading for anyone seriously concerned with it. This book is an earnest, impassioned, broadly informed, and clearly written effort to shed considerable light on a notion that has become increasingly amorphous and is in danger of becoming but an empty slogan. Dallmayr thickens the notion and challenges us to consider more carefully what calls for "diversity" and "pluralism" concretely entail, and he thoughtfully and intelligently outlines for us, with a vast array of resources at his disposal, what a healthy pluralism involves.

[1] Stikkers, "Instrumental Relativism and Cultivated Pluralism: Alain Locke and Philosophy's Quest for a Common World," in The Critical Pragmatism of A lain Locke, ed. Leonard Harris (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1999), pp. 209-16.

[2] Stikkers, "Royce and Gadamer on Interpretation as the Constitution of Community," Journal of Speculative Philosophy 15 (2001): 14-19.

[3] Caputo, Radical Hermeneutics (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1987).

[4] See, e.g., Larry A. Hickman, Stefan Neubert, and Kersten Reich (eds.), John Dewey between Pragmatism and Constructivism (New York: Fordham University Press, 2009).

[5] Rosenblatt, The Reader, the Text, the Poem: The Transactional Theory of the Literary Work (Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1994).

[6] See Marilyn Fischer, Carol Nackenoff, and Wendy Chmielewski (eds.), Jane Addams and the Practice of Democracy (Champaign: University of Illinois Press, 2009); Maurice Hamington, Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Feminist Ethics (Champaign: University of Illinois Press, 2004) and The Social Philosophy of Jane Addams (Champaign: University of Illinois Press, 2009); and especially Michael Jostedt's forthcoming dissertation at Southern Illinois University Carbondale, "Addams and Gadamer: Learning to Listen with the Other," which offers a critique of Gadamer's hermeneutics from the perspective of Addams's pragmatism and pluralism. See, too, Jostedt, Midwest Pragmatist Study Group, Indiana University Purdue University Indianapolis, Sept. 26, 2010,

[7] Addams's The Long Road of Woman's Memory (1923; Champaign: University of Illinois Press, 2010) especially illustrates this judgment.