Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology

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DePaul, Michael and Linda Zagzebski (eds.), Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2003, 306 pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199252734.

Reviewed by Jennifer Lackey, Northern Illinois University


While there is a vast amount of writing on the concept of a virtue and its role in various areas of philosophy, this literature is fairly fragmented, with historians, ethicists, and epistemologists rarely engaged in direction conversation with one another. In light of this, Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology is a most welcome collection of essays in which virtue epistemologists and virtue ethicists—including ethicists grounded in the history of philosophy—for the first time take up various issues in consultation with each other. The volume is divided into five parts and contains eleven articles by some of the leading scholars in both ethics and epistemology; the overall quality of the contributions is very high. Since there is not a single theme uniting all of the articles (other than focusing on virtue), I shall begin by providing a brief summary of each contribution to the volume. I shall then offer some critical remarks on a thesis that is espoused, both directly and indirectly, by several of the authors included in this collection.

In the first essay of the volume, “The Structure of Virtue,” Julia Annas focuses on two aspects of virtue as they figure in the virtue ethics tradition: skill and success. She shows that unlike Aristotle, the majority of the ancient tradition regarded virtue as a kind of skill. Moreover, though virtue requires success, there is the overall aim of an action and the immediate aim. While the Stoics claimed that success requires the attainment of the ultimate aim, Annas points out that knowledge requires the attainment of the immediate aim of forming a true belief. Because of this, Annas concludes that there is reason to doubt that virtue can be used as a basis for a definition of knowledge.

Nancy Sherman and Heath White argue in “Intellectual Virtue: Emotions, Luck, and the Ancients” that virtue epistemologists have neglected some of the central resources of classical virtue ethics; most notably, the role of affect in intellectual virtue, and the role of luck in acquiring knowledge. They defend the Aristotelian view that even though beliefs are not fully voluntary because the emotions that influence them are not, we can still be held responsible for our beliefs because we are not fully passive regarding our emotions. With respect to luck, Sherman and White argue that while the Stoics were largely correct that happiness is not a matter of luck, they were wrong to extend this view to knowledge. Because of this, they conclude that at least on this issue, virtue epistemology should be kept separate from virtue ethics.

In “Virtue Ethics: Radical or Routine?” David Solomon argues that there is an important distinction between two different kinds of virtue ethics. The routine approach focuses on the ordering of evaluative concepts and claims that the concept of virtue is more basic than the concepts of a right act or a good state of affairs that dominate traditional ethical theories. The radical form focuses on deeper questions about the nature and aim of ethics, including themes such as a suspicion of rules and principle and a focus on the importance of the whole life as the primary object of ethical evaluation. Solomon argues that a failure to appreciate this distinction between routine and radical forms of virtue ethics has led to confusion and misunderstanding among moral philosophers, and he urges virtue epistemologists to be sensitive to this type of distinction in epistemology so as to avoid similar confusion.

Jorge Garcia argues in “Practical Reason and its Virtues” that the instrumentalist conception of practical reasoning embraced by consequentialists is not capable of protecting humanity from the moral horrors of the twentieth century. Instead, Garcia proposes a theory of the moral life that has four characteristics: (1) it is role-centered, (2) virtue-based, (3) patient-focused, and (4) input-driven. According to Garcia, this approach, unlike that favored by consequentialists, has the resources to protect against tyranny.

In “Knowledge as Credit for True Belief,” John Greco attempts to resolve two central problems for fallibilistic epistemology—the lottery problem and Gettier problems—by focusing on the link between knowing that p and deserving credit for truly believing that p. Greco holds that S’s reliable cognitive character must be the most salient part of the cause explaining why S holds the true belief in question. In lottery scenarios, a subject does not know that she will lose the lottery because it is “just a matter of chance that S believes the truth”; accordingly, salient chance undermines deserving credit for getting things right about the outcome of the lottery (p. 124). In Gettier cases, Greco claims that “there is something odd or unexpected about the way that S comes to believe the truth” and, hence, that this kind of abnormality trumps the salience of S’s otherwise reliable cognitive character (p. 131). Thus, in both cases, we can explain why S fails to have the knowledge in question within the constraints of fallibilism.

Linda Zagzebski, in “Intellectual Motivation and the Good of Truth,” argues that the value of a motive can contribute value to the overall act that it motivates. Applying this to the cognitive realm, Zagzebski argues that an act of believing that is motivated by the love of the truth is more valuable than both an act of believing that has the aim of the love of truth but without the motive and an act of believing that brings about the consequence at which the love of truth aims but without the motive. Zagzebski then suggests that the value of the relevant motive can explain the additional value that knowledge has over mere true belief; in particular, it is only in the case of knowledge that a subject gets credit for believing the truth.

In “The Place of Truth in Epistemology,” Ernest Sosa takes up this same issue: what makes knowledge more valuable than mere true belief? He answers that a state of knowing, unlike that of mere true believing, is one in which the truth is grasped in a way that is creditable or attributable to the subject’s own skills and virtues, and thus to the agent herself. But then how do we explain the value of the beliefs possessed by an evil demon victim who conducts her epistemic life impeccably? In response, Sosa introduces the notion of “performance value,” which, in the epistemic realm, is the value of a belief performance that would normally produce true beliefs when operating in a suitable environment. So, even though performance value is understood in a truth-connected way, a state of believing can have this epistemic value even when it misses the mark of truth. This allows for a full account of epistemic value within an epistemology in which truth is the only fundamental value.

In “How to be a Virtue Epistemologist,” Christopher Hookway argues that virtue epistemology is currently distinguished from other epistemologies only by the thesis that knowledge and justification should be analyzed in terms of the virtues. This is in contrast to many virtue ethicists, who have launched a more dramatic critique by urging a shift away from focusing on the moral “ought” and toward what is needed for living well. Hookway then shows that virtue epistemologists could make a similar critique by urging a shift away from focusing on justification and knowledge and toward evaluating the activities of inquiry and deliberation.

Wayne Riggs argues in “Understanding ’Virtue’ and the Virtue of Understanding” that the highest epistemic good is a state that includes more than the achievement of true beliefs and the avoidance of false ones—it requires an understanding of important truths. Moreover, he argues that reliable success in leading to the truth cannot be a component of the intellectual virtues, since intellectual giants such as Newton and Galileo had many false beliefs. According to Riggs, the import of the virtues can be more fully appreciated when we move beyond a mere truth-directed epistemology in these ways.

Christine McKinnon argues in “Knowing Cognitive Selves” that the kinds of knowledge claims that we make of both other persons and ourselves do not meet the ideals of objectivity, impartiality, and value-neutrality traditionally required by epistemologists. Since these kinds of knowledge are important aspects of our cognitive lives, McKinnon urges us to rethink epistemology so as to accommodate them. To this end, she suggests that responsibilism has a methodological advantage over reliabilism since the latter assumes that reliability can be determined independently of the ways in which agents employ methods of belief-acquisition.

In the last article of the volume, “Humility and Epistemic Goods,” Robert Roberts and Jay Wood take a different direction than the other contributors by providing a detailed treatment of a single virtue: intellectual humility. They begin by situating humility in relation to its opposing vices, particularly vanity and arrogance. They then argue that, unlike those who are vain, humble people are not concerned with how they appear to others and, unlike those who are arrogant, humble people are interested in entitlements only insofar as they serve some valuable purpose. Roberts and Wood then consider several ways in which intellectual humility leads to various epistemic goods.

Now, since a review of this length does not permit a detailed discussion of each of these papers, I shall instead focus my evaluation on a theme that is found in several of the articles—namely, that knowledge is something for which we deserve credit. More precisely:

CREDIT: S knows that p only if S deserves credit for truly believing that p.

This thesis is espoused explicitly by Greco, Sosa, and Zagzebski (and Riggs in other works), and it is also one to which some of the other authors, such as Sherman and White and McKinnon, seem implicitly committed. Thus, focusing on CREDIT will make for a fairly comprehensive treatment of the book as whole.

I shall proceed as follows. I shall first formulate what I take to be the most plausible account of credit to support this thesis. I shall then argue that even with this plausible account in hand, some of the most ordinary and uncontentious cases of knowledge show CREDIT to be false.

Greco’s piece provides a nice place to begin since not only does he offer an explicit account of what he calls intellectual credit, his conception of credit also seems to be operative in the views of some of the other authors, such as Zagzebski, Riggs, and McKinnon. According to Greco:

IC: S deserves intellectual credit for believing the truth regarding p only if
a. believing the truth regarding p has intellectual value,
b. believing the truth regarding p can be ascribed to S, and
c. believing the truth regarding p reveals S’s reliable cognitive character.
(p. 123)

The key condition of IC is (c), and there are at least two important aspects to this requirement. First, S’s deserving credit for truly believing that p requires that such a state of believing reveal S’s reliable cognitive character. Otherwise put, S’s reliable cognitive character must be the most salient part of the cause explaining why S holds the true belief in question. For instance, suppose that Martin comes to truly believe that drinking Bacardi rum enhances one’s sex appeal, but only because of the subliminal suggestions contained in their ads. Now, in order to even be properly receptive to the subliminal suggestions, at least some of Martin’s cognitive faculties—such as sense perception and memory—must be functioning reliably. But if asked why he truly believes that drinking Bacardi rum enhances one’s sex appeal, we would point not to the reliable functioning of his cognitive faculties, but to the subliminal suggestions of Bacardi’s ads. For though the former is a necessary condition of Martin’s holding the true belief in question, only the latter carries the explanatory burden of why he holds it. Hence, Martin’s belief about Bacardi’s rum fails (c)—that is, it fails to reveal his reliable cognitive character—despite the necessity of the reliability of his cognitive faculties.

Second, in order for S to deserve intellectual credit for truly believing that p, the belief in question must reveal S’s reliable cognitive character. To illustrate this general aspect of condition (c), Greco provides an example of “…a poor fielder [who] makes a spectacular catch. In this case he will be given credit of a sort—he will get pats on the back from his teammates and applause from the crowd. But it won’t be the same kind of credit that Griffey gets. Griffey makes spectacular catches all the time—his catches manifest his great skills. Not so when Albert Belle makes such a catch. If the catch is difficult, it is almost just good luck that he makes it” (p. 122). Applying this reasoning to the topic at hand, it looks as though Greco would deny knowledge to the intellectual analogue of Albert Belle because such a subject would be undeserving of the requisite kind of intellectual credit.

But why does Greco think that the right sort of credit is absent in this type of case? The reasoning underlying this assessment seems to go as follows:

(1) A mediocre fielder (thinker) who makes a spectacular catch (intellectual achievement) is acting out of his fielding (intellectual) character.
(2) If S’s accomplishment of Øing is out of S’s character, then S’s Øing is “almost just good luck.”
(3) If S’s accomplishment of Øing is the result of good luck, then S does not deserve credit for Øing.
(4) Therefore, a mediocre fielder (thinker) does not deserve credit for making a spectacular catch (intellectual achievement).

Premise (2), however, is surely not generally true, for acting out of character is not always due to good luck. For instance, compare the following:

Case 1: Because of his laziness and average abilities, Oliver has always been a mediocre chemist, receiving just passing grades in graduate school in chemistry, securing a dead-end job after graduation, and struggling to publish papers that are nearly entirely derivative from the work of others. But yesterday the fates were smiling down on Oliver: while he was in the lab doing work, Oliver stumbled upon a truly brilliant discovery through the purely lucky combination of two errors of reasoning.
Case 2: Because of her lack of self-confidence and average abilities, Dorothy has always been a mediocre chemist, receiving just passing grades in graduate school in chemistry, securing a dead-end job after graduation, and struggling to publish papers that are nearly entirely derivative from the work of others. Recently, however, Dorothy found herself in a very happy relationship that quite dramatically affected her perception of herself. This, in turn, gave her more confidence in her abilities as a chemist. As a result, yesterday was an incredible day for Dorothy: while she was in the lab doing work, she made a truly brilliant discovery through her own hard work, powers of reasoning, and skills as a researcher.

In cases 1 and 2, we have subjects who both, so to speak, “act out of their cognitive character”. In particular, both Oliver and Dorothy make brilliant discoveries in chemistry which are quite unexpected in light of their past mediocrity in this area. But while Oliver’s finding is primarily the result of luck and error, Dorothy’s emerges from her own faculties and skills combined with overcoming prior doubts and limitations. This type of phenomenon is common enough—an average tennis player has an outstanding game through intense concentration, an otherwise timid and cowardly person performs an act of incredible heroism out of profound love, a mediocre composer creates a sublime sonata after experiencing exquisite beauty. In all of these cases, a person’s accomplishment is not a matter of luck in any problematic way, despite being quite significantly out of character.

To be sure, there may be important differences between the intellectual credit that a subject such as Dorothy deserves and that found in the following:

Case 3: Meredith has always been regarded as an extraordinary chemist, receiving the highest possible grades in graduate school in chemistry, securing an outstanding job after graduation, and publishing articles in top ranked journals that are nearly entirely original and uniformly profound. While she was in the lab last week, Meredith made yet another truly brilliant discovery through her own powers of reasoning and skills as a researcher.

Notice: the cases of Dorothy and Meredith do not represent the difference between merely apparent credit and genuine credit, respectively. Rather, unlike Oliver whose discovery is primarily a matter of good fortune, the intellectual achievements of both Dorothy and Meredith result from the working of their own faculties and skills, and are thus creditable to them in a substantive sense. Of course, because Meredith’s accomplishment reflects a more richly developed cognitive character, the kind of intellectual credit that she deserves may be deeper than that had by Dorothy. But it should be clear that even if there are two different kinds of intellectual credit represented in these cases, only the weaker kind found in Case 2 could plausibly be said to be necessary for knowledge. For, surely Dorothy can know the content of the discovery she makes through her own hard work, powers of reasoning, and skills as a researcher, despite the fact that her lack of confidence has led her to produce only mediocre work in chemistry in the past. Thus, contrary to what is suggested by Greco’s example of Albert Belle, not only does Dorothy properly deserve intellectual credit for the true belief in question, it also represents the kind of credit that must be at issue when talking about knowledge.

There is, however, an even stronger conclusion that I think we can draw from these considerations; namely, that it is a mistake to follow Greco and other virtue theorists and analyze intellectual credit—at least the kind said to be necessary for knowledge—in terms of revealing a subject’s cognitive character. We think of a person’s character as being fairly stable; when significant changes occur in someone’s character, they usually evolve over a long period of time or are the result of a dramatic event. Because of this, when a person makes an unexpectedly spectacular achievement, it may be natural to regard it as being out of character and thereby incapable of revealing the person’s character. Accordingly, when credit is analyzed in terms of revealing a person’s character, such unexpectedly spectacular achievements turn out to be ones for which the subject in question fails to deserve credit, thereby leading to the consequence that mediocre thinkers cannot have knowledge of outstanding intellectual discoveries. But surely it is not just great people who deserve credit for or can have knowledge of great things. A person’s achievement can result from the working of her own faculties and skills and thus be properly creditable to her without necessarily revealing her character.

Thus, a more plausible account of the kind of intellectual credit said to be necessary for knowledge—one that seems to be what Sosa has in mind in his essay—should replace (c) of IC with the following:

c*. believing the truth regarding p reveals S’s relevant reliable cognitive faculties.

Otherwise put, S’s reliable cognitive faculties must be the most salient part of the cause explaining why S holds the true belief in question.

Even with (c) replaced with (c*), however, I shall now argue that CREDIT is false. To see this, consider the following:

Case 4: Having just arrived at the train station in Chicago, Morris wishes to obtain directions to the Sears Tower. He looks around, randomly approaches the first passerby that he sees, and asks how to get to his desired destination. The passerby, who happens to be a Chicago resident who knows the city extraordinarily well, provides Morris with impeccable directions to the Sears Tower.

There is nothing that is particularly unusual about Case 4, and it is nearly universally accepted that a situation such as Morris’s not only can but often does result in testimonial knowledge. Yet it is precisely this sort of case that shows CREDIT to be false. For notice: are Morris’s reliable cognitive faculties the most salient part of the cause explaining why he truly believes that the Sears Tower is, say, six blocks east? Not at all. Indeed, what explains why Morris got things right has nearly nothing of epistemic interest to do with him and nearly everything of epistemic interest to do with the passerby. In particular, it is the passerby’s experience with and knowledge of the city of Chicago that explains why Morris ended up with a true belief rather than a false belief. Moreover, notice that Morris “randomly” chose the passerby that he did, and so even the fact that he received the information from one source rather than another cannot be attributed to Morris. Thus, though it is plausible to say that Morris acquired knowledge from the passerby, there seems to be no substantive sense in which Morris deserves credit for holding the true belief that he does. Hence, CREDIT is false.

Nevertheless, although cases of this sort pose a difficulty for CREDIT, I suspect that something in the neighborhood is not only correct, but also expresses one of the features that makes knowledge more valuable than mere true belief. Moreover, despite the fact that I followed tradition and focused on problems with some of the views expressed in this volume, let me close by saying that Intellectual Virtue is a superb collection of essays that anyone interested in either epistemology or ethics should find both extremely valuable and engaging.