Interactive Justice: A Proceduralist Approach to Value Conflict in Politics

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Emanuela Ceva, Interactive Justice: A Proceduralist Approach to Value Conflict in Politics, Routledge, 2016, 196pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138676466.

Reviewed by Sanjay Lal, Clayton State University


Today's seemingly intractable value disagreements in liberal society are readily apparent to even the most casual of observers. Emanuela Ceva's book aims to show the serious contributions academic philosophy can make in helping our world deal with the problems brought about by our competing ideas of the good. More specifically, Ceva seeks to contribute to justice-focused academic discussions in political philosophy by drawing attention to "interactive justice" (the absence of which she identifies as a cause of injustice). Accordingly, she emphasizes the procedures by which social institutions should handle value conflicts we must deal with. Doing so, she maintains, "reveals an important sense in which the inherent justice of procedures should concern political philosophers alongside (but not instead of) the justice of outcomes." (p. 7)

Significant to Ceva's thesis is her claim that intractable value conflicts in society (which she ties to the lack of ideally reasonable persons involved) that reach an impasse largely result from the "antagonistic" (as opposed to cooperative) dynamics through which such conflicts are articulated (p. 43). (She cites the Terri Schiavo case as an example in this regard.) Issues of interaction (as opposed to those of outcome) thereby become relevant to conflict management as well as to the realization of a more just social order given that "certain procedures are constitutive of inherently morally relevant forms of human interaction in politics and society." (p. 7) Thus, Ceva argues, it follows that much of the wrongness of being engaged in conflicts articulated through antagonistic dynamics can be attributed to such engagement exposing parties to inherently morally unacceptable treatment. (p. 16) Ceva sees herself as carving out a space between theories of conflict resolution (which aim to secure end-state justice) and conflict containment (which aim to secure peace) to show the importance the idea of interactive justice has for complementing existing notions of how value disagreements should be handled by social institutions. Ultimately, she alleges, both proponents of conflict resolution and conflict containment "build on normative presuppositions assuming away the problem of what liberal institutions ought to do to establish a cooperative form of interaction." (p. 47) Therefore, Ceva maintains, considerations of such matters are vital for producing the cooperative dynamics each side needs for realizing their valued aims.

For Ceva it is the procedures of conflict management that "are constitutive of cooperative interactions between the conflicting parties because interacting cooperatively is engaging in such procedures." (p. 47 emphasis in original) Accordingly, much time is spent discussing and clarifying different notions of proceduralism. For Ceva, it is of vital philosophical significance "that procedures . . . may be a locus of justice for quite distinct reasons and in accordance with quite different standards from those employed to evaluate the qualities of outcomes" (p. 74). She calls this view "intrinsic prodecuralism" and cites the principle of due process in legal proceedings as an example (p. 75). Notably, as David Miller's rape survivor example (borrowed from Jodie Foster's character in The Accused) shows, it is plausible to imagine one who has been violated to feel additionally wronged by not having her voice heard (or given due consideration from her point of view) even if she approves of the punishments (outcomes) rendered by outside authorities to those who have wronged her. Thus Ceva concludes, "The moral status of all involved actors -- be they accusers, defendants, or witnesses -- must be reckoned with and adequate procedural provisions must be designed, whether these also contribute to truth-finding or not." (p. 76)

Ceva argues her "intrinsic" procedural account should be articulated through four structural levels" (p. 101). She writes:

at level 0 (L0), the normative justice-relevant presuppositions on which the theory builds are made explicit; at level 1 (L1), a procedural principle of interactive justice is formulated in keeping with the normative presuppositions of L0; level 2 (L2) requires that specific procedures be devised to make the principle of interactive justice in L1 operative in light of the normative presuppositions of L0; finally, level 3 (L3) concerns the actual interaction on the basis of the specific procedure(s) developed at L2.

Only the first two levels, Ceva claims, exist within the domain of philosophical theorizing. This claim helps her ensure that a theory can be cogent across varied contextual settings.

After much preliminary clarifying and bolstering of concepts related to intrinsic proceduralism, in the final part of the book Ceva seeks to demonstrate the practical import of her points.  She is concerned with the way they relate to matters of interactive justice within the overall context of the intractable value conflicts that are considered to be at an impasse in politics. The adversary argumentation principle (AAP), as explained by Stuart Hampshire, becomes crucial to this work. Ceva summarizes the principle as "the idea that each side in a conflict should be heard." (p. 112) From this principle she derives an "acceptability test" that is meant to provide a basis for justifying procedural equality (p. 118). "This test", Ceva states, "consists of asking anyone how they should be treated were they to adopt the perspective of a party to an intractable value conflict at an impasse in politics for the terms of their interaction to be morally acceptable to them." (p. 124) Ceva argues this test can claim a broader constituency of justification than that implied by Rawls' view that the liberal project demands public justification of a society's basic structures only to ideally reasonable persons. (p. 120) As a result, she sees her views as more in line with the demands of liberal pluralism. Furthermore, she does not find problematic her acknowledgments that her acceptability test excludes so called "conflict profiteers" and political anarchists since she does not see the former group to be in a morally relevant position and regards the latter group to have self-excluded themselves from the types of procedures she considers. (p. 123)

Ceva addresses (more or less ably) questions regarding her thesis that her more philosophically minded readers may have asked earlier (pp. 134-ff.). Toward the end of Chapter V, she shows that viewing the AAP as a just principle for managing conflict and her acceptability test as a viable procedural tool do not commit her to more controversial meta-ethical positions. For Ceva this point seems crucial for preserving a minimalist understanding of her recommendations (which, in turn, also enables them to be in line with liberal pluralism). Additionally, she argues that the inconclusiveness (in regard to resolving conflicts) of the AAP and the seemingly already well-established place of egalitarian procedures of adversary argumentation in liberal democracies do not undermine her contribution. These points follow from her position that (1) principles of justice should not be evaluated only according to whether they can lead to acceptable resolutions of conflicts and (2) from her intentions not being merely explanatory and analytic but also normative (in the sense that she is calling for liberal institutions to adopt procedures that complement those intended to resolve or contain conflicts).

Ceva devotes her last chapter to fleshing out how interactive justice can be realized in practice. The key idea she elaborates is that conflict management procedures ought to be developed in a way "that puts the conflicting parties in a position to pursue an understanding of their conflict as a joint problem" (which is contrasted with addressing the conflict as "one's own problem"; p. 143-ff.). In an attempt to illustrate how the procedures she calls for look in practice, Ceva elaborates specifically on three distinct types of conflict management procedures: transformative meditation, sustained dialogue, and any conflict management procedure "that must be preceded by preparatory procedures of de-escalation" (p. 151). Ceva holds that the boundaries separating these types are flexible but nonetheless clear enough to help us determine what is morally required in specific instances which call for considerations of procedural (and thus interactive) justice.

Overall, Ceva offers a unique and needed contribution to discussions of justice as well as to the existing literature on peace studies. This is the case even though her wordy, dense, and overly technical (even by the standards of academic philosophy) writing style may make it difficult to see right away. Furthermore, it is not always so clear that Ceva is successful in maintaining an agnostic stance on meta-ethical questions. It would be helpful, for example, if she elaborated on her recommendation that moral disputants present their views "as descriptively as possible" (p. 52, p. 147) as this is a recommendation which seems to clearly require a certain cognitive understanding of moral beliefs. Also, discussion on epistemic matters pertaining to the degree of certainty parties involved in value conflicts can rightfully claim about their beliefs would have been in order but is notably absent.
Nonetheless, Ceva succeeds in showing the plausibility of ways to handle conflicts that move us away from common and simple attempts to defeat opponents, that the methods we use can be just as important morally as the outcomes we reach, and that value conflicts run deeper than the political disputes they are symptoms of (and therefore require different kinds of considerations) (p. 20-ff.) Furthermore, her command of and deep engagement with a broad and diverse body of relevant literature is impressive. Thus, Ceva offers both theorists and practitioners much important insight on matters of justice and peace.