Interpreting Philosophy: The Elements of Philosophical Hermeneutics

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Nicholas Rescher, Interpreting Philosophy: The Elements of Philosophical Hermeneutics, Ontos, 2007, 184pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793442.

Reviewed by Pol Vandevelde, Marquette University


Nicholas Rescher gives us a metaphilosophical account of the practice of philosophy. In the preface, he addresses metaphilosophy as the "poor and neglected cousin" of philosophy. As a discourse about what philosophy is and how it functions, the book is both a diagnosis of contemporary philosophy and a prescription for what it should be.

Rescher diagnoses contemporary philosophy as multifaceted and fractious, challenging any attempt to find a unity in the proliferation of investigations that are increasingly specific with regard to their topics (for example, the many types of applied philosophy), their perspective (for example, feminism), or their method (linguistic and conceptual analysis or deconstructionism, for example). This specialization and division of labor among philosophers have created a tension between technicality and accessibility, so that "after World War II it becomes literally impossible for American philosophers to keep up with what their colleagues were writing" (48).

Despite this diagnosis of how fractious philosophy has become, Rescher nevertheless attempts to determine how philosophy should be done. He adopts the traditional view that philosophy is a meaningful cognitive enterprise (10), the goal of which is "to bring intelligible order into our often chaotic experience of the world" (2). Unlike literature, the mission of philosophy is not to stimulate our imagination, but "to provide informative instruction" (29).

Philosophy is intrinsically interpretation, not only in the sense of interpreting other authors, but primarily of interpreting experience and reality. The texts of philosophy are provided by the world of experience, Rescher tells us (163). Because philosophy is anchored in experience, philosophy is not pure reason alone and does not deal only with universal and necessary truths. Instead philosophy has to settle for "how things stand generally and usually" (115). As a consequence, certainty as a goal has to be traded for the "most promising estimate of the true answer" (3). This also means that philosophical writing is not submitted to strict rules. Instead we have guidelines as rules of thumb so that philosophers can make themselves understandable to their readers.

Combining description and prescription, Rescher divides his book into twelve chapters, each devoted to a parameter of philosophical practice; for example, how the topics are treated (compared to a scientific approach), the process used for examining these topics, the use of terminology, the type of reasons given to substantiate the claims made, the rules followed, and the interconnections among philosophical issues.

Let us review some of the positions defended by Rescher. In Chapter 2 he examines why philosophy needs interpretation. He offers four main reasons: 1. "the physical artifacts … underdetermine the texts" (philosophical discourse is not a mimetic rendering of reality); 2. "the texts underdetermine the meaning at issue" (because they may be vague, equivocal, or enigmatic); 3. the texts "do not succeed in saying what the author means" (21-22); and 4. "the texts conflict with what the author says elsewhere" (23). If we have to interpret what philosophers say, there will be different interpretations of the same text. This diversity however does not mean that multiple interpretations are "equally meritorious" (26). Rescher defends a coherence theory of interpretation according to which a text has to be congruent with its context. "It is in fact coherence with the resources of context (in the widest sense of this term) that is at once the appropriate instrument of text interpretation and the impetus to objectivity in this domain" (27-28). By "context" Rescher means the other texts related to the one we interpret as well as the material world in which this text arose, so that there is a commonality of experience (via the world) between interpreters and writers.

Although we cannot expect to find in his brief chapter on hermeneutical methodology a discussion of the multiple theories of interpretation, the version Rescher gives of what interpretation means remains overly general. For example, Rescher distinguishes what a text means for its author and what it means for us, without taking into account the long and sophisticated history of such a distinction since E.D. Hirsch made his famous distinction between meaning and significance. This leaves the reader wondering about what is meant by "author": is it the historical writer, the hypothetical author construed by the reader or the ideal author proposed by the writer? And is meaning the literal meaning of the text or what the author meant? And could any of these be so without being construed so by readers and thus also being a "meaning for us"?

In Chapter 4 Rescher addresses the issue of the agenda of philosophy. Since philosophy is an interpretive field, decisions are made to determine which issues, methods or approaches are chosen, promoted and discarded. And since the philosophical community is too "balkanized for doctrinal coherence" (51), there is a dispute about what the agenda is. However, such a dispute about what is worth philosophizing about is itself part of the philosophical enterprise. It is in the nature of philosophy to be permanently in crisis, not only regarding its foundations, but also regarding its objects and methods.

As linked to the question of the agenda of philosophy, Rescher discusses the different efforts made at offering a taxonomy of philosophical positions (Chapter 6), whether it is about the source of knowledge (empiricism, rationalism or a mix of the two) or the styles of philosophical thought (naturalism, subjective idealism, objective idealism). After reviewing some of these taxonomies (offered by Carus, Dilthey, Eisler, Pepper) Rescher offers his own meta-taxonomy, or taxonomy of taxonomies, dividing them into a priori and a posteriori classifications.

In the chapter on argumentation (Chapter 7) Rescher examines what kind of reason may be relevant for substantiating a philosophical position. He reiterates the traditional distinction between rhetoric and argumentation, and sees philosophy as a combination of the two. Rhetoric attempts to win acceptance of a position by emphasizing some appealing features of the position at stake, whereas arguments attempt to provide reasons for substantiating a claim. While argumentation is a form of inferential reasoning, rhetoric is a "noninferential substantiative appeal" (90). While we need indeed inferential substantiation of the claims made in philosophy (argumentation), rhetoric allows our experience to be part of what can substantiate philosophical positions. Thus, what philosophy should strive for is a harmonization of these two modes of substantiation, discursive-inferential and rhetoric-evocative.

In an interesting chapter on apories (sic) (Chapter 9) Rescher shows the positive role they play in the formation of philosophical discourse. Usually an apory arises within a cluster of statements, one or some of them being incompatible with the others. The solution usually consists in abandoning one or more of the claims or in reformulating some statements and refining the claims in question by introducing additional distinctions. This reformulation may lead to the framing of new questions. There is thus a dialectical development that can be summarized in the following linkage: concept proliferation leads to concept sophistication, which leads to doctrinal elaboration, which in turn leads to system complexification (135).

Because philosophy is interpretation of the world of experience and itself in need of interpretation, philosophical issues neither impose themselves fully framed nor are they isolated. There is a native interconnection of philosophical issues that requires a multilateral approach if we want to do justice to a particular issue under consideration. As Rescher advises philosophers, "one must always look beyond text to context" (152). In order to do that Rescher offers four laws, which are the laws that should be followed when interpreting (Chapter 11). The first one is contextual coherence. Rescher argues for his own brand of coherence in interpretation. The goal is "optimization" in the sense of evaluating possible interpretations and determining their respective merits and possibly deciding which one is the best. Such optimization is achieved when a "systemic unification" of the factors involved in interpretation is reached. In the case of text interpretation these factors are: context, author, date, philology, intellectual history. The second law of interpretation is comprehensiveness. If we broaden the context of a text, our interpretation will be more secure in determining which interpretations are more or less plausible. The third law is sophistication. By taking into account more details within a broad context, an interpretation can make a stronger claim to adequacy. Thus, a better interpretation is one that is more nuanced and complex than its competitors. The fourth law of interpretation is imperfectability. There is a limit to which an interpretation can be perfected. Going beyond that limit of high plausibility may introduce complications into the interpretation and render it inelegant. The limit point of adequacy is thus a combination of "plausibility/tenability and simplicity/elegance" (162).

The last chapter is a prospective view of philosophy at the turn of the century, which Rescher characterizes as a return to systematic philosophy. It is a new kind of system that is combined with an awareness of the complexities of the issues at hand. Instead of traditional systematic philosophy done by individuals in the model of a pyramid, the new systematic philosophy is more like an anthill and done collectively without one philosopher mastering all the linkages of the system. "Philosophizing at the end of the century thus has a new form -- one which (like the science of the present) calls for collaborative teamwork, albeit of disaggregated and unorganized sort (unlike the science of the day)" (182).

In the whole book Rescher wants to speak about philosophy in general. Although he has a small chapter on deconstructionism and mentions several continental philosophers, the focus is essentially on the practice of Anglo-American philosophy. The drawback would have been a bigger book, but it would have been very interesting to see a comparison between the philosophical writings in Anglo-American philosophy and phenomenology, for instance, or an account of the philosophical writings of fringe characters like Foucault or Deleuze. Rescher states, for example, that "effective communication about philosophical issues is difficult enough; there is no point in making it harder for oneself than it needs to be" (4). In this regard, it would have been helpful to see Rescher take up the challenge posed by phenomenology, which holds that writing also consists in bringing the reader to see, feel, and think what the writer tries to reveal. For in this case the difficulty of writing is not exclusively one of expression (and thus not due to a lack of skill on the writer's side), but a difficulty of perspective, the one the reader is asked to adopt, the writing of Merleau-Ponty or of Derrida being the means to reach such a perspective.

Instead Rescher uses deconstructionism as a contrast to what philosophical practice should be. Three features are offered to characterize deconstructionism: omnitextuality (the interpretation is itself a text), plasticity (every text admits multiple interpretations) and equivalency (all interpretations are equally valid). Rescher refers to Derrida but it is not clear how the second and third features can be ascribed to Derrida. It seems that Rescher chooses these features of deconstructionism as salient because of his own assumptions and convictions about what a rational enquiry must be and for which the question of validity is central. A more careful study of Derrida would have shown that his version of deconstructionism focuses on how a text functions and not on whether what it says is true. Hence, Rescher's view of philosophy as an interpretation of experience or in need of being interpreted is alien to Derrida's framework, since the question for Derrida is precisely about the boundaries of a text or an interpretation and not about the relationship of two preexisting objects.

Furthermore, when Rescher becomes more specific about particular views of Derrida it leads to surprises. It is, for example, rather odd that Derrida is accused of logocentrism whereas Derrida is the one who made that word popular against traditional philosophy.  Rescher understands logocentrism as the view that everything is a matter of language (26), which he rejects. However, Derrida did not use the word in this sense at all. Logocentrism is for Derrida the traditional metaphysical and common sense view that consciousness is immediately present to itself and its objects. Similarly, when Rescher addresses Derrida's critique of the privilege of the voice over writing, Rescher understands the voice as the process of producing texts and writing as the end product, i.e., the texts produced. This again is alien to Derrida's use of the terms. Writing is for Derrida a form of inscription that has always already preceded even our speech acts, because we use a system of oppositions and differences embedded in our language. The fact that our speech is itself inscribed in a system of differences of which speakers are not consciously aware (but which can be "deconstructed") causes a dissemination so that any immediacy we may believe we have with what we think (or with the objects we refer to) turns out illusory.

Let us finally lament the fact that the merit and qualities of the book are significantly obscured by the poor quality of the manuscript. It is indeed more a partly edited manuscript than a book. Firstly, there is no index, and this despite the fact that Rescher has a chapter ("The personalia"), including even statistical data, on the different manners philosophers have referenced other authors. Rescher himself remarks that "the information afforded by the name index of a philosophical book reveals its author in an illuminating and not always flattering light" (57). Secondly, the book is riddled with typos. And thirdly and more importantly, several passages and paragraphs are repeated verbatim or with slight variations in intervals of several pages. For example, the first and second full par. p. 26 are repeated as the first, second, and part of the third full par. p. 34; the first par. p. 27 is repeated as the second par. p. 35; the last par. p. 27 and the first and second full par. p. 28 are repeated with a slight variation as the first three full par. p. 36; p. 124 is paraphrased on p. 129; part of the last par. p. 47 (continued on p. 48) and of the second par. p. 48 are repeated with some variations within the second and third full par. p. 173 and again within the first full par. p. 174. Part of the last par. p. 48 is repeated with slight variation at the top of p. 175.

Overall, this book is a nice attempt to offer a general metaphilosophical account of the philosophical practice, bringing together in the form of parameters what individual philosophers may see as central to philosophy, like argumentation, rules or message, or what individual philosophers may see as a threat to philosophy, like the agenda or the apories.