Inventing the Market: Smith, Hegel, and Political Theory

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Lisa Herzog, Inventing the Market: Smith, Hegel, and Political Theory, Oxford University Press, 2013, 184pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674176.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Church, University of Houston


In recent years several excellent studies of Adam Smith have appeared which examine the relationship between his moral and economic thought.[1] Scholars have also extensively analyzed Hegel's views of political economy, and have documented the influence of the Scottish Enlightenment on his thought.[2] Herzog, however, provides the first systematic comparison of Smith's and Hegel's conceptions of commercial society. Her book, in line with recent literature, corrects the persisting, one-sided interpretations of Smith as a proto-libertarian and of Hegel as a statist central-planner. One of Herzog's contributions is to show that the two philosophers share much more in common on economic matters than is often thought, and hence that their views are more nuanced than the one-sided interpretations suggest.

Since much of the recent literature has already corrected the misperceptions about Smith's and Hegel's philosophies of the market, this is not the main contribution of Herzog's book. Instead, the strength of the book lies in her application of Smith's and Hegel's views to contemporary debates in political theory concerning personal identity and communal responsibility, social justice, and the nature of freedom. She argues that Smith and Hegel represent two rival visions of commercial society that have animated and divided contemporary theorists on these issues. Herzog demonstrates that by returning to Smith and Hegel, we can bring greater sophistication to contemporary discussions.

The first two substantive chapters provide an overview of Smith's and Hegel's views of commercial society and contextualize these views within their broader philosophies. In her chapter on the market in Smith, Herzog focuses on the dynamic relationship between "nature" and "artifice" in his moral and economic thought. For Smith, human beings have a natural propensity to "truck, barter, and exchange," but, Herzog points out, not "all natural tendencies have good consequences and should therefore be followed" (26). Instead, our natural sentiments should be educated and shaped by a market system well-regulated by government that secures private property and ensures the "education and the physical and psychological well-being of the population" (36).

Herzog reads Hegel alongside Smith and finds several similarities. Namely, both claim that commercial society serves an educative function for the passions, and both call for robust legal protections of property and free exchange. However, Herzog argues that there are important differences between the two philosophers as well. First, she holds that the "Smithian vision that economic growth would expand the cake for all is absent from Hegel's view of the modern economy" (56). A few pages later, Herzog amends the point, stating that "This exchange economy may lead to economic growth, but this point is not central to Hegel" (59). Second, Hegel views the market as "inherently unstable and unpredictable," producing through its vicissitudes a permanent underclass or "rabble" that threatens social and political order (54). Unfortunately, on both counts, as I will discuss below, I think Herzog offers a misleading description of Hegel's view.

What emerges from her initial comparison of Smith and Hegel are two models of commercial society:

Smith's serene picture of the free market as bringing justice, equality, social cohesion, and freedom, and Hegel's view of the market as a sphere of subjective freedom, but also as a chaotic, disruptive play of forces that needs to be tamed by other institutions. (147)

In the second part of the book, Herzog proceeds to apply these competing models to contemporary issues in political theory. In so doing, she finds further similarities and differences between Smith and Hegel. In chapter 4, Herzog revives the liberal-communitarian debate and situates Smith and Hegel in the Rawls-Sandel debate about the "unencumbered self." Smith and Hegel both conceive of the self in general as "encumbered", freighted with social ties and loyalties that deeply shape identity. However, in the market, Smith encourages individuals to be less encumbered, less tied to any one location or occupation, so as to keep the "labour force . . . 'flowing' into different sectors" (73). By contrast, Hegel envisions a market in which individuals are rooted much deeper in their vocations, since the "recognition individuals receive in civil society is bound to their profession" (77). These rival visions of the market, Herzog argues, drive two quite different understandings of how individuals relate to the community.

Chapter 5 takes up two important questions of social justice: are market outcomes deserved, and is inequality justified? On the first question, Herzog shows that, for Smith, the bourgeois virtues of industry and thrift are rewarded in the market. It is hence salutary to connect desert to market results in order to encourage the bourgeois virtues. By contrast, for Hegel, Herzog argues, market vicissitudes and success through sheer luck make "ascriptions of desert in the market . . . extremely problematic" (100). On the second question, Smith and Hegel share the view of poverty not only as a problem of "material deprivation" but also as a loss of dignity and self-worth (107). Yet they differ in their diagnoses -- Smith holds that economic growth helps lift individuals out of grinding poverty, whereas Hegel maintains "silence" in the face of its inevitability (110).

Herzog's discussion of freedom in chapter 6 is the high point of the book. In this chapter, she moves beyond the well-worn conceptual debates about negative and positive freedom. Instead, she examines Smith's and Hegel's understandings of "the right balance between different aspects of freedom" in concrete commercial and political institutions (121). She begins by noting Smith's and Hegel's shared concern about the threats to autonomy in a commercial society. The division and specialization of labor leads for Smith toward repetitive, mindless tasks and hence "stupid and ignorant" workers (124). For Hegel, through material accumulation, individuals seek recognition from their fellows, which leads to a problem of "keeping up with the Joneses" and the loss of a sense of mastery over one's own life (127). Smith looks to "moral education" to "direct vanity to proper objects" and restore self-command to human beings, whereas, for Hegel, corporations supply a satisfying form of recognition among fellow workers (131).

Throughout the book, Herzog deftly incorporates a variety of voices from contemporary political theory, sociology, and economics. Her range is quite impressive, as is her ability to bring these classic texts into discussion without compromising the quality of the historical scholarship. The analysis of Smith and Hegel is excellent throughout, and the application of the two helps us think about these old problems in new and productive ways.

I do, however, have a few concerns. The main problem as I see it (admittedly knowing Hegel much better than Smith) is that the presentation of Hegel is misleading at points. This problem is significant because it vitiates some of Herzog's overall claims about Hegel's contribution to contemporary debates.

Consider again Herzog's account of Hegel's differences from Smith, which in my view are problematic. First, it is true that the market for Hegel is less predictable and more harmful than for Smith. However, it isn't true that economic growth is "absent from Hegel's view of the modern economy" (56). Hegel states that

As the association of human beings through their needs is universalized, and with it the ways in which means of satisfying these needs are devised and made available, the accumulation of wealth increases (Philosophy of Right, trans. Nisbet, section 243).

Hegel's description here of the expansion of "population and industry" shows he actually shares with Smith the commitment to economic growth.

It is important to recognize this point because the difference between Smith and Hegel is much deeper than an economic disagreement. Rather, the difference is rooted in competing accounts of the nature and development of human needs in civil society. As opposed to conceiving of human needs in Smith's naturalistic terms, Hegel conceives of the distinctively human need, the desire for recognition, as limitless. As our desires become "universalized," in Hegel's terms -- that is, the more we place the general esteem of others over our particular natural needs -- civil society must produce ever more elaborate luxuries for us to prove our status. As it does so, civil society grows richer. However, the feverish pursuit of recognition also creates great misery as a class emerges that is systematically obstructed from that recognition.[3] Herzog's misleading account of Hegel's static economy is a missed opportunity, then, for a deeper engagement between Smith and Hegel over the underlying mechanisms causing instability, discontent, and poverty in the modern market.

Hegel departs from Smith in a second way, for Herzog. As opposed to Smith, Herzog argues, Hegel envisions the market as "inherently unstable and unpredictable" (54), a "disruptive, Dionysian play of forces" (138). This picture, too, is misleading. Indeed, it is true that for Hegel contingency and luck suffuse the market and create instability and inequality (Philosophy of Right, section 200). As a result, individuals in the modern market "give vent to . . . discontent and moral irritation" at its seeming injustice. However, Hegel is concerned nonetheless to perfect the science of political economy, which allows us "to recognize, in the sphere of needs, [the] manifestation of rationality". In fact, Hegel is particularly impressed by political economy because it "finds the laws underlying a mass of contingent occurrences." In so doing, it has a "conciliatory effect" on us (Philosophy of Right, section 189). I find Hegel's account of the rationality of the market difficult to square with Herzog's picture of the market as a "Dionysian play of forces".

By conceiving of Hegel's market in Dionysian terms, Herzog forecloses more sophisticated applications of Hegel to some of the contemporary debates she discusses. For instance, in her discussion of social justice, she argues that Hegel can provide us with little positive guidance to overcome the problem of poverty. Indeed, Herzog sees him ultimately as silent on this issue in the face of the chaos of the market (110). If we conceive of the market not in Dionysian terms, however, we can try to apply the rational structures and practices of Hegel's modern commercial society in different ways to try to solve the problem of poverty.[4]

These, however, are relatively minor concerns about an otherwise rich and thoughtful study of these two philosophers.

[1] See, among many others, Fonna Forman-Barzilai, 2010, Adam Smith and the Circles of Sympathy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; Ryan Patrick Hanley, 2009, Adam Smith and the Character of Virtue, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; Samuel Fleishacker, 2004, On Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations: A Philosophical Companion, Princeton: Princeton University Press; James Otteson, 2002, Adam Smith's Marketplace of Life, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; Charles Griswold, 1999, Adam Smith and the Virtues of Enlightenment, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

[2] On Hegel's views on political economy, see, among many others, Albena Neschen, 2008, Ethik und Ökonomie in Hegels Philosophie und in modernen wirtschaftsethischen Entwürfen, Hamburg: Meiner; Hegel on Economics and Freedom, William Maker (ed). Macon: Mercer University Press, 1987. On the influence of the Scottish Enlightenment on Hegel, see Norbert Waszek, 1988, The Scottish Enlightenment and Hegel's Account of 'Civil Society', Dordrecht: Kluwer.

[3] See Jeffrey Church, 2010, "The Freedom of Desire: Hegel's Response to Rousseau on the Problem of Civil Society," American Journal of Political Science 54:1 125-139 for further development of these ideas.

[4] For a recent attempt to solve the problem of poverty in Hegel's thought, see Joel Anderson, "Hegel's Implicit View on How to Solve the Problem of Poverty," in Beyond Liberalism and Communitarianism, Robert Williams (ed.). Albany: SUNY, 2001, 185-205.