Iris Murdoch's Ethics: A Consideration of her Romantic Vision

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Megan Laverty, Iris Murdoch's Ethics: A Consideration of her Romantic Vision, Continuum, 2007, 134pp., $144.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826485359.

Reviewed by Christopher Cordner, University of Melbourne


Modern moral philosophy has followed in Aristotle's footsteps not Plato's. Aristotle highlights 'the virtues'. By highlighting love and the good, Iris Murdoch once again brought Platonic ideas alive, making them accessible in a contemporary idiom.

This bent of her philosophy is, I am sure, one reason it has so engaged people, but perhaps it is also why so few of the philosophers who have expressed their indebtedness to Murdoch's moral philosophy have written directly about it. Contemporary analytic philosophy still resists, or perhaps just has not been able to find its own words for, what Murdoch had to say as a philosopher.

Megan Laverty describes her book as not aiming 'to replicate Murdoch's ideas' (12), but as 'an exercise in methodological mimesis or iteration' (12). What she writes will be 'a way of "going on" with Murdoch's concepts or terms' (12) rather than an analysis of them. Laverty situates Murdoch within the tradition of what (following Nikolas Kompridis) she calls 'philosophical romanticism' (2). She says that the 'authority of Murdoch's philosophy … is given by its location in, and its ability to comment on, a larger philosophical tradition, in this case romantic' (2). This is a bold move, given Murdoch's criticisms of romanticism, which Laverty brings out. But Laverty also reminds us that for Murdoch Plato was one of 'the great romantics' (7).

Laverty sees philosophical romanticism as a response to Kant, a response seeking what Laverty (taking up a phrase of Murdoch's) calls a 'third way' (19) between Kant's locating of noumenal reality beyond consciousness and a lapsing into subjectivism. She writes: 'Murdoch and the romantics comprehend, without bridging, the gap between human subjectivity and reality, by bringing the noumenal within the sweep of human experience' (9). Thus Laverty locates Murdoch's work in concerns that have been and continue to be central to philosophy; and she speaks to these concerns in ways that should engage thinkers both within and without analytical philosophy.

Laverty's sketch of the bent of philosophical romanticism is widely shared. What is novel in her book is first of all locating Murdoch directly in this tradition, and secondly, the changes she sees Murdoch making to romanticism's attempt to comprehend that 'gap'. Laverty argues that the changes are both of philosophical content and of philosophical form. The main difference of content (I'll come back to it below) is what Laverty describes as Murdoch's 'feminising' of romanticism; while the difference of form, or philosophical style, lies in

the philosophical significance of the literary dimensions of Murdoch's philosophical writings -- the ironical juxtaposition of imagery, the contrastive play of assertive unequivocal generalisation with self-deprecating, doubtful questioning and the coincidence of ordinary language with that of religious and philosophical discourse. (13)

And these two kinds of difference are themselves interdependent -- the difference in style is itself an element of a feminised romanticism.

Rather than just surveying the many illuminating elements of Laverty's discussion, I want to engage at greater length with several variations on one main theme of Laverty's book. But first I would like to note that what is most impressive and striking in the book is, in my view, Laverty's account of Murdoch's 'feminising' of romanticism. This one theme subsumes several others. Murdoch's distinction between romanticism and 'the great Romantics', Laverty's account of the sublime as 'any experience which induces learning' (5), her comparison of romantic irony and Murdochian humility, and her exploration of the 'literary dimensions' of Murdoch's philosophical writing (including her discussion of the stylistic differences between the earlier and later philosophy): each of these sub-themes (and there are more) is developed perceptively and subtly in its own right, but they all also elaborate the larger theme of the feminising of romanticism. And Laverty is very persuasive in arguing that this theme gives Murdoch's philosophising of the true and the good its distinctive cast. Let me illustrate.

Laverty agrees with Murdoch that no philosophical 'vision' can be complete, and that philosophers have to work against their own natural tendency to 'wrap things up neatly'. She very nicely brings out Murdoch's emphasis (more in Metaphysics as a Guide to Morals than in the earlier writings) on our human disposition to make sense of ourselves and our world by telling stories. Perhaps the activity of making sense just is that of telling stories. But stories impose form on experience which of itself lacks form, so the very telling of them immediately carries the risk -- no, not just the risk, the inevitability -- of also falsifying what it discloses. Humility is the quality shown in acknowledging this perpetual 'incompleteness' of vision, and in being correspondingly always open to learning. The quality of humble openness to the ever-present possibility of learning is part of Murdoch's 'feminising' of the sublime, historically given a 'masculine' emphasis on our heroic power to transcend the world of experience. Humility replaces heroism in the feminised sublime, which is also specifically imaged, indeed enacted, in the increasingly tentative, exploratory, open-ended, creatively ambiguous character of Murdoch's later philosophical writing. In these ways, but also in others, Murdoch's feminising of romanticism aims to provide the substance of her philosophical 'third way'.

Some readers may feel that Laverty quotes too much from Murdoch. But the reason for so much quotation, I take it, is to break up as much as possible any false unity that her narrative of Murdoch's philosophy might otherwise insinuate, by letting the reader hear the 'particular eloquence' of Murdoch's philosophical voice. The accompanying risk is that either Murdoch's philosophy or Laverty's account of it will sometimes appear simply fragmentary or inchoate or confused rather than rich and multi-faceted. On the whole I think Laverty negotiates this risk very nicely.

I turn to my main reservation, or complex of reservations, focusing on related aspects of Murdoch's 'third way'. I have reservations about Murdoch as well as about Laverty's presentation of some of Murdoch's views, and first, a reservation that applies to both. Laverty quotes Garrett Green favourably as saying that 'philosophy is engaged with the question of life as a whole, reality in its entirety or "the world as such"' (30). Italicising 'as such' does not clarify that last phrase, and 'the question of life as a whole' and 'reality in its entirety' are just as opaque. But whatever one thinks of those phrases, Laverty has earlier several times represented Murdoch as emphasising the 'formlessness' of reality (on the face of it a strange emphasis in one who through her philosophical life wrote 'under the banner' of Plato, for whom the Forms were at the heart of reality). And in spelling out how Murdoch's philosophy is 'premised on a version of Kant's Copernican Revolution' (4), Laverty writes that

Murdoch concludes that noumenal reality, constituted as the absence of consciousness, must be, by definition at least, formlessness; devoid of meaning and unity, reality is sheer nothingness. This nothingness … is the reality that transcends consciousness and is so very difficult for us to acknowledge. (4)

But, at least as Kant has it, noumenal reality is no more 'formless' than formed, no more 'devoid of meaning and unity' than possessed of them, no more 'nothingness' than something; and so noumenal reality is not 'something' which can be 'difficult for us to acknowledge'. Perhaps human beings somehow find themselves 'representing' noumenal reality in these ways, and then they (so to speak) manufacture something to be frightened of, something that is indeed 'difficult to acknowledge', but this is no longer what Kant meant by noumenal reality. Put simply, Murdoch's 'void' is not Kant's noumenal reality. Here I think Laverty's presentation is mostly true to Murdoch, but does not reflect awareness of the problem with her view.

This may seem like a small point, even a finicky, technical one, but it ramifies. Later Laverty writes: 'although our descriptions of reality are ultimately illusory they keep the dream of reality alive and in so doing provide understanding and insight'. This is hard to follow. Our descriptions articulate 'meaning' for us, and the understanding and insight they afford is surely linked to that meaning. But reality 'as such', we have been told, is devoid of meaning. It is then not at all clear how the dream of (meaningless, 'void') reality enables our meaning-constituting descriptions to provide 'understanding and insight'. Laverty also at one point tells us (rightly enough) that 'Murdoch and the Romantics comprehend, without bridging, the gap between human subjectivity and reality, by bringing the noumenal within the sweep of human experience' (9). Well, that can be read as a post-Kantian attempt to overcome the noumenal-phenomenal divide, but the problem, in relation to the passages I've just been quoting, is that Murdoch's dialectic depends on her having set the divide up in the tendentious way I sketched: human beings have constantly failed to recognise that all of their 'descriptions' project meaning onto a meaningless world, a 'void'; 'the void' is the noumenal, how things really are, and we can't improve until we acknowledge that. If, against this, it be said that the idea of the void is not functioning at that (so to speak) transcendent level because the noumenal has now been brought within the sweep of experience, the problem shifts. For then it is no longer a 'noumenal' truth that reality is meaningless, void, etc.; instead this becomes just one more description, with no claim to reflect 'reality as such' more deeply or truly than any other. But then the problematic with which Murdoch (and Laverty) begin cannot be stated in the terms we've been considering.

Here is a related tension in Laverty's formulations. On the one hand we are told that Murdoch 'thinks that romanticism, properly understood, entails … a recognition of one's self as relational and required to be attentive to others' (86). This idea -- of the self as relational -- seems integral to Laverty's account of the Murdochian 'third way'. No doubt the idea can be developed in various ways, but common to them would be the thought that the 'meanings' articulated in my relationships (my 'descriptions') are not a merely illusory projection onto a 'really' void and meaningless reality, for if they are such a projection the self that projects them is not fundamentally relational. The metaphysical assumptions behind that 'projection' picture of reality surely drop away if the relational character of the self is taken seriously. If 'the good individual recognises that it is others … who are most real' and that the most important thing for her is 'to involve herself with what is other -- … other individuals, language, academic studies, good art and literature' (87), then it can scarcely also be that the real challenge is for us to confront the 'nothingness that transcends consciousness and is so very difficult for us to acknowledge' (4). If 'it is others who are most real', then reality as 'so difficult for us to acknowledge' because it is void and meaningless is not what is 'most real'. We are also told that '[u]nselfing entails that consciousness becomes less determined by the self and more available to reality. This reality that consciousness becomes determined by is principally made up of other individual selves who are also centres of meaning' (108). On the face of it, to say that the reality that transcends consciousness is 'nothingness -- death, chance, void' is very different indeed from saying that this reality is 'principally made up of other individual selves who are also centres of meaning'. The second passage allows for consciousness as 'relational'; the earlier quotation does not.

In place of the 'prototypically masculine romantic protagonist, independent, isolated, intensely dedicated to his art, in possession of a muse, and an explorer of new and dangerous territories', Murdoch offers us her 'mother and daughter-in-law example and daily domestic chores (such as sweeping the floor, paying the bills and potting plants)' (85). And later Laverty also mentions the person facing a decision whether 'to keep the retarded child at home, ask the elderly relation to go away, leave the family in order to do political work' (109). The way in which such a person made these decisions might indeed show her consciousness as determined by the reality of the 'individual selves' around her. And the rhetoric of her having to confront the 'nothingness that transcends consciousness and is so very difficult for us to acknowledge' then seems out of place. Indeed that rhetoric is perhaps itself a vestige of the 'prototypically masculine romantic' perspective -- with its 'independent, isolated' non-relational self -- that Murdoch is opposing. Perhaps some of Murdoch's insights have to be rescued from her own formulations.

Laverty quotes this from Murdoch: 'Goodness is connected with the acceptance of real death and real chance and real transience' (96). The phrase 'connected with' implies a link between two distinguishable things: goodness is not the same as 'acceptance of real death and real chance and real transience', even if it requires that acceptance. What more does goodness involve? According to Murdoch, it involves love (or, since love can have better and worse forms, 'loving attention'). Laverty herself, though, comes very close indeed to equating goodness (or at least love) with something like this 'acceptance'. She says: 'To accept the determination of consciousness by an undetermined reality is love' (87). But even if the word 'accept' is allowed to bear a great weight in this 'definition' of love, I do not think it is true. Think again of those examples - 'the mother loving the retarded child or loving the tiresome elderly relation' -- that Murdoch speaks of in connection with the questions:

Should [the] retarded child be kept at home or sent to an institution? Should [the] elderly relation who is a trouble-maker be cared for or asked to go away? Should an unhappy marriage be continued for the sake of the children? The love which brings the right answer is an exercise of justice and realism and really looking. (44)

Surely the love spoken of here is not simply or essentially 'accept[ing] the determination of consciousness by an undetermined reality'. When John Donne wrote: 'Gentle love deeds, as blossoms on a bough / From Love's awakened root, do bud out now', he was celebrating a generative power that surely is not contained within Laverty's formulation, and Murdoch's examples suggest something similar.

I think a similar reductionist tendency (as it seems to me to be) can be found in some (not all) of what Laverty says about the sublime. She writes: 'Sublime experiences involve an encounter with death, chance, and the reality of other individuals' (96). In 'a confrontation with the limits of representative consciousness -- death, chance, banality, the void or meaninglessness', Laverty continues, 'the individual experiences the sublime as an educational sacrament or source of good energy' (97). Let us agree that when confrontation with those things is indeed experienced as 'an educational sacrament or source of good energy', we have the sublime. But such a confrontation need not be so experienced. Svidrigaylov and Stavrogin, powerfully drawn characters in two of Dostoevsky's novels, are men whose recognition of 'the void or meaninglessness' is expressed in their sheer despair. They are driven right up against their own incapacity to love. The point is that so far as confrontation with death, chance, meaninglessness, etc. is experienced as a source of good energy, that experience is already drawing on (though it may also nourish) a capacity for love in the subject. That capacity does not have its origin in the confrontation with those things.

Laverty might seek to defend the 'definition' of love I quoted from her, by invoking the distinction she draws in her final chapter between 'two senses of love' in Murdoch, one from her meta-ethics and the other from her philosophical psychology. Of the 'psychological' sense Laverty says: 'It typically describes a form of attachment: either between parent and child, as in the case of filial love; or between friends, as in the case of Platonic love; or between sexually intimate individuals, as in the case of romantic love' (104). Laverty then says that 'Murdoch has romantic love in mind when she is describing psychological love', and Laverty confines herself to romantic love in discussing the first sense. She says that the second sense of the term is 'modelled on the first, but refers, meta-ethically, to the relationship of consciousness to its imaginative unifying pictures and the embodiment of those unifying pictures in the variegated surface of art, literature and life' (105). Perhaps it is this second sense of love that Laverty has in mind when she says that 'accept[ing] the determination of consciousness by an undetermined reality is love'. Something else she says might confirm this: 'Love, in this second sense, directs consciousness to seek reality that is outside its own limit' (106). But this does not distinguish the second sense of love. All of the loves Laverty mentions as exemplifying the first sense of love can be realised in better or worse ways. Any parent can come to see that she has not loved her child as well as she should have, and in seeing this she is not imposing a standard on her love from outside it. The point is that anyone who thinks of herself as loving her child or friend or spouse thereby recognises herself as answerable to the requirement to love well, however much or often she may fail to do so. (This is also an aspect of Plato's ascent of love in the Symposium.) But that answerability is already an orientation to a 'reality that is outside the limit' of her present actual loving. To divide this up into two 'senses' of love, as Laverty does, seems to me to multiply difficulties rather than to resolve them, and also not to be true to Murdoch's idea of love.

I'm sure Laverty would have responses to many of my comments. I'd guess, for example, that she might think closer attention to what she calls the 'carefully situated ambiguity' of many of Murdoch's formulations would resolve at least some of my concerns. Be that as it may, I do not want my critical comments on Laverty's argument to leave a distorted impression of my opinion of her book. Laverty has taken philosophical discussion of Murdoch a good deal further for us all, even in those places where we may disagree with her. And beyond disagreement, Laverty's book offers a wealth of insight and illumination, both about Murdoch and about the broader issues of continuing philosophical importance to which she links Murdoch's work. Anyone interested in Murdoch's philosophy, but also others with an interest in the wider context in which Laverty locates Murdoch, will find Laverty's book stimulating and fruitful. And it will certainly become an indispensable text for further philosophical work inspired by Murdoch's writings.