Irony and Idealism: Rereading Schlegel, Hegel, and Kierkegaard

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Fred Rush, Irony and Idealism: Rereading Schlegel, Hegel, and Kierkegaard, Oxford University Press, 2016, 312pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688227.

Reviewed by Allen Speight, Boston University


In his ambitious and insightful new book, Fred Rush begins by noticing the developments in the academic discussion of German romanticism that have taken place over the last twenty years. Once mostly the province of literary scholars, the field of German romanticism also came to acquire in this period remarkable new interest within the Anglophone philosophical world.

One question raised by this new philosophical attention, of course, is just what is meant by "romanticism" at all. Rush notes the wide valence of the term in a cultural and historical sense: there is, as he argues, both a "permeability" between national borders that has allowed reciprocal influence between German and English or French sources of inspiration, as well as a wide swath of appeals to a notion of romanticism that has been embraced by such diverse writers as Schelling, Coleridge, Abrams and Lovejoy.

Rush is particularly interested in what is now usually characterized as "early" German romanticism, a term employed above all to distinguish between pre- and post-Napoleonic phases of German romanticism and centering (depending on how one counts these things) on the small town of Jena and the years 1796-1801. Although the ambit of even this more restricted cultural phenomenon involves a fairly wide constellation of figures (Novalis, Ludwig Tieck, Wilhelm Heinrich Wackenroder, Friedrich Schleiermacher, August Schlegel, etc), Rush keeps his focus on three main authors: Friedrich Schlegel, who emerges at the center of Jena romanticism; Hegel, who came to Jena late and whose idealist approach is often taken simply to be in opposition to romanticism; and Kierkegaard, whom Rush sees as offering a kind of synthesis that is both responsive to and critical of its romantic and Hegelian sources.

The focus on Schlegel and Hegel -- widely celebrated for the disdain with which the two viewed each other -- poses the question of romanticism's relation to idealism. The romantics are by some readers sharply distinguished from idealism and by others placed along more of a continuum. While Rush clearly differentiates the two, his overall argument is designed to bring them in closer connection than many earlier interpreters have. While it was standard for years to follow Hegel's lead in construing romanticism as largely a development out of Fichte, Rush points instead to a deeper connection he sees between the romantics and Kant. Schlegel and Novalis should be seen, he argues, as inheritors of a kind of Kantian regulativism, in a way that radicalizes Kant in favor of something that is "more contingent, historical and pragmatic" (what Rush calls a "tentativeness" at the heart of German romanticism).

Within the development of the post-Kantian engagement of romanticism, a further question concerns how to understand the figures usually identified as central to the movement -- how to place the philosophical stresses represented by Novalis as opposed to Schlegel, for example. Here Rush declares that it's Schlegel who should be taken as the most romantic romantic (or at least the romantic who is able to pose the most successful challenge for Hegel and others outside the movement).

The key term for Rush's consideration of romanticism within its own development and in relation to idealism is the romantic figure of irony. His argument here is that a proper understanding of the romantic notion of irony lies behind post-Jena philosophical developments from Hegel to Kierkegaard. On this view, Schlegelian irony is seen less as a poetic mode than a primary way of exploring subjectivity: Rush's stress is on Schlegelian irony in the context of individual agency and what he calls the "first-personal sense of lived regulative cognitive and cultural orientation."

Hegel's notion of dialectic in this context is understood as having an "uncomfortable proximity" to Schlegel's sense of irony, although Rush thinks the Hegelian system must be characterized as "retrospective and autotelic" in contrast with the Schlegelian system of fragments which is "prospective and tentative" (p. 10). On Rush's view, Hegel might be seen as a sort of "irresolute romantic," one who tries to nail down philosophical stability too soon and at a cost to the chaos that Schlegel can take on; the "really resolute romantic" would be one who denied the sort of resolution that Hegel craves.

The book's two long chapters on Schlegel and Hegel are followed by a shorter chapter that presents Kierkegaard as offering a synthetic view. As Rush argues, Kierkegaard's "controlled" notion of irony allows him both to make use of Hegel's line of critique against Schlegel and to employ Schlegelian resources in turn against Hegel. Key here is Kierkegaard's notion of "spheres of existence" (aesthetic, ethical, religious) and the transitions among them.

There is much to recommend Rush's account of the development of this triad of views. He deftly avoids many of the caricatures that exist on both sides of the romanticism/idealism literature, and his readings of the "existential" side of Schlegelian irony as well as its proximity to Hegelian dialectic offer a wealth of insights. Rush both explores the later Hegel's official take on Schlegel (offering along the way a useful analysis of what Hegel drew from his Berlin colleague Karl Wilhelm Ferdinand Solger) and takes up the engagement between the two at its most keen in the Phenomenology of Spirit's remarkable contestation at the end of the "Spirit" chapter between notions of the ironic and judging "beautiful soul."

Despite the evident characterization of the Schlegelian beautiful soul here as "evil," Hegel is actually more positive about romanticism in the Phenomenology than he is later. Both Hegelian and Schlegelian notions of individuality must come to terms with the historical complexities of the world that the beautiful soul frames, and they must orient themselves within that world. Rush's characterization of the world we reach at the end of the Spirit chapter seems exactly right: romanticism, as he puts it, is "Spirit at terminal velocity" -- the inheritor of the world that "we" have somehow made in the wake of the Greeks, the Romans, the French Revolution and Kant, and whatever loss it must suffer is in some way "our loss," the loss of something that affects us as contemporaries.

All this, of course, is about Hegel's engagement with and debt to Schlegel; there is meanwhile little to notice about what Schlegel takes on in the reverse direction. This imbalance might lead one to ask exactly what we are to make in retrospect of the contestation that Rush describes. Where does his account leave us in terms of finding the traces of romanticism and idealism within the contemporary philosophical and cultural world?

Rush's presentation of the heart of the challenge of Schlegelian romanticism is that it should best be seen as focused on matters of value. So "the crux of the Jena view" -- something Rush points out that Hegel really does get about Schlegel (despite all his criticisms) -- is in the ethical, political and aesthetic realms (p. 278), and it's these that are particularly worth examining in the wake of his account.

In terms of ethical and social philosophy, it can be tempting to see the idealist/romantic divide as something of an either/or: either the notion of a self that is actualized in terms of laws, or the "concrete particular person as a ground for decision" (122). While Rush avoids this sort of contrast, he does tend to underplay the selfhood available within idealism. As he says, "Idealism is not in the business of the elimination of subjectivity of course, but it does tend toward something like the reduction of it in favor of a third-person perspective on thought and oneself" (p. 112). It's not clear that Hegel simply separates law and self or just takes one side of the field. The larger section of the Phenomenology in which the Beautiful Soul appears -- the section on Conscience -- would be a place to look for the latter, particularly if we make use of recent readings of that section, such as Dean Moyar's Hegel's Conscience, that stress the positive valences that come out of this section. The point is that Hegel needs such a notion of conscience precisely because it has overcome the Kantian opposition of universal/particular in a way that unites them in a concrete piece of action (and thereby also brings together the developed action of Spirit as a whole as manifesting stages of agency, from the recognitive dimension of action in Greek ethical life forward).

Politically, it's true, as Rush points out, that romanticism seems to have a certain tendency to anarchism, but it's equally striking that both Schlegel and Hegel also come in the end to be accused of a certain kind of political or religious accommodationism. It would of course be as unfair to seek Hegel's legacy in the politics of pre-1848 Berlin as it would be to seek Schlegel's in the court of Vienna. The roads to Berlin and Vienna would of course in any case represent different kinds of failure. Hegel's, alas, would be one in which the institutional center does not hold, but splits, left and right. Schlegel's is harder to characterize. Although Richard Rorty's irony/sociality relation rests on a different notion of irony than that of the romantics, the notion of a duality of spheres of public and private still represents something that might seem an inevitable condition for pursuing romanticism in the modern world. Whether one appeals to Rorty or not, it does seem that the romantic needs to come to terms with some experience of the contingency of efforts at ironic selfhood in the larger world and the ways those may be either anarchic or accommodative. Irony as activity of self is a hard demand, and one might not expect that more than a few like-minded individuals could engage in Schlegelian ironic overlap sufficiently to broker the conflicting needs of complex economic and political life. Rush himself seems to acknowledge that the idealists did better when it came to the extension of their normative project into the larger-scale political and legal world.

In the case of art and aesthetics, the contestation Rush sees between romanticism and idealism is one that defines itself in terms of Schlegelian irony and the aesthetic mode that Hegel seemed to think offered the potential for a modern idealist counter to it. This is the notion of humor, with its appeal to the potential for richness and absorption in the everyday -- though, as Hegel seems caustically to warn, not the "subjective" appeal to humor characteristic of romantics like Jean Paul but the more "objective" sense he found in writers like Sterne. If these are the terms of the contest, Rush's account might seem to compel one to the view that, when it comes to contemporary modes of literary, visual and musical art, the ironists took the upper hand in the post-Jena aesthetic world. Whether these are indeed the only modes open to modern aesthetics is, however, a very good question, and Rush explores the synthetic potential of Kierkegaard's thought as a mode along which both humor and irony might both be employed. One conviction that is clearly shared by both Hegel and Schlegel is their new sense that art matters to us as moderns in a different way than to any of our cultural or philosophical predecessors. Hegel's official view about this is of course bound up with his rarely correctly understood notion of the "end of art," But most of the viable post-Danto modes of thinking this notion through at the moment seem to involve some exploration of art's staying power in a way that does not lose sight of at least some of the common concerns between Hegel and the romantics that Rush emphasizes.

One line of potential expansion of the sort of project that Rush is engaged with here is the connection between Schlegelian and Hegelian approaches to the task of re-conceiving the modern notion of religion. This was a task of peculiar urgency, of course, within the Jena circle, and one that the work of contemporary figures like Asad and Mahmood reminds us is not entirely a matter of antiquarian interest. Both Hegel and Schlegel made early appeals to the importance of such a reconception -- for Schlegel as early as the Rede über die Mythologie that appears in his Gespräch über die Poesie (written in the wake of his reading of Schleiermacher's On Religion: Speeches to its Cultured Despisers and Novalis' Christianity or Europe) and for Hegel in the Religion chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit. Both then focused in their respective projects post-1807 (as they read Creuzer and others) on a new understanding of symbolic form and its relation to religion. For Schlegel and Hegel, this "new" understanding of religion was highly dependent on art and the work of the artist -- Hegel even going so far as to call art the "first interpreter" of religious ideas. The common features in these accounts open up some important avenues of potential constellationary connection for future research. This leads to the larger historical project of tracing religious and artistic development back to pre-Western cultures; to a wider account of religious anthropology; to a new awareness of the notion of the unconscious; and above all to an account that might link more closely the task of romantic symphilosophieren and the underlying triad of art, religion and philosophy that Hegel's mature system always both connected and differentiated as modes of absolute spirit.

Rush's book is an extremely well-written and perceptive addition to the philosophical literature on the contest between romanticism and idealism. Given the philosophical and linguistic difficulty of many of the original sources it treats with care, as well as the thorniness and persistence of the issues that lie in the critical space between idealism and romanticism, it will serve as an invaluable resource for scholars of early to mid 19th-century European philosophy.