Is Science Compatible with Free Will?: Exploring Free Will and Consciousness in the Light of Quantum Physics and Neuroscience

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Antoine Suarez and Peter Adams (eds.), Is Science Compatible with Free Will?: Exploring Free Will and Consciousness in the Light of Quantum Physics and Neuroscience, Springer, 2013, 326pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781461452119.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, University of Oxford


Philosophers who work on free will are frequently irritated by articles by scientists, usually neuroscientists, proclaiming the death of free will. Sometimes these articles report good science, but the arguments against free will constructed on the basis of the results reported are question-begging, when not simply irrelevant. The majority of the chapters in this book exploring the relation between science and free will present us with a mirror-image of this kind of work. They aim to vindicate free will, not to kill it. As in the case of the debunkers, excellent science is deployed, by people closely engaged in it. But the results are every bit as frustrating, because the arguments for the existence and nature of free will are at their very best question-begging and inadequate.

This book brings together a number of papers presented at a workshop in Barcelona in 2010; the majority of the presenters are European and most are scientists. The original workshop was organized by Antoine Suarez, who is a member of the Center for Quantum Philosophy. In his preface to the book, Suarez tells us that the original workshop was designed to discuss the idea that science is compatible "with phenomena governed by nonmaterial principles, like, for instance, free will and consciousness". This preface, with its artless claims about the nature of consciousness and free will, and its frank aspiration to show that human beings are partially "spiritual" beings, is representative of much of the book, which combines scientific sophistication (or rather, sophistication within the scientific domain that the contributor knows well) with philosophical naivety.

The book is divided into three parts, on quantum physics, neuroscience and the reconciliation of free will and science respectively. The first section, on quantum mechanics, is the one most characterized by philosophical naivety. The five chapters that make up this section present the reader with (relatively) accessible discussions of major topics in quantum mechanics, such as entanglement, nonlocality, Bell inequalities and the free will theorem, with most of the chapters written by scientists closely involved in ongoing work to test the predictions of quantum mechanics. These chapters will be useful to philosophers, especially insofar as they present a strong case for a nondeterministic interpretation of quantum mechanics (One chapter, by Gilles Brassard and Paul Raymond-Robichaud presents a dissenting, deterministic, view; the view is somewhat similar to the many-worlds interpretation, but rather than having each collapse of the wave function constitute a branching point of different worlds, they postulate the continued existence, within a single universe, of the superposition of both possible states. Due to our cognitive limitations, they suggest, we experience only one state of the superposition).

Since I am in no position to adjudicate the debates between the rival positions sketched, I will limit my comments to the claims made about free will and its compatibility, or lack thereof, with the science. It is here that sophistication gives way to naivety, not to mention sometimes bizarre speculation. In every contribution, 'free will' is understood to require indeterminism; acknowledgement that compatibilism even exists is limited to a single footnote. Much worse, 'free will' is for the most part implicitly identified with indeterminism, and quantum indeterminism at that.

Suarez acknowledges that some people have seen a threat to free will in indeterminism, and promises to show us that quantum events can be controlled by free will. But the proof seems to consist in the statement that it is compatible with physics that a mind outside space-time could influence such events; no hint of a mechanism is provided and no suggestion as to how this influence might constitute control. Since he maintains that the kind of control that such a mind can exercise is identical to the kind of control elementary particles themselves exercise, it is plain that this kind of control won't solve the kinds of problems indeterminism is often said to present for an account of free will. Indeed, contributors have free recourse to their naïve intuitions about free will in their physical theorizing. Gisin, for instance, in his excellent discussion of nonlocality, rejects the many-worlds interpretation partly on the basis of the claim that were it true, we would lack free will. It is only in Merali's contribution that anything approaching a genuine argument for the incompatibility of free will and determinism is presented, with Merali claiming that Conway and Kochen's free will theorem entails that unless the experimenter's choices are undetermined, she must somehow be constrained in what measurements she can make of a particle's spin.

The papers in this section are valuable and even exciting. For both newcomers to these issues and for those with some degree of prior knowledge, they provide an excellent view of some difficult issues in contemporary physics. Moreover, creative philosophers may well find the ideas expressed here relevant for their theorizing about free will. But the philosophical speculations that accompany the science illustrate only the dangers of straying outside one's area of expertise.

The middle section of the book, on neuroscience, exhibits far less naivety than the first, because most of the authors have the good sense to remain within their areas of expertise and not to speculate on free will. There is excellent and philosophically relevant material here -- particularly Fogassi and Rizzolatti's overview of some recent work on mirror neurons and the attribution of intentions -- but its relevance to free will is, at best, indirect and goes undiscussed by the authors. The main exception is Tononi's speculations concerning the implications of his important work on consciousness for free will, which are suggestive but underdeveloped. Tononi claims that an action is free if it is caused by maximally integrated information, and that entails that free actions are caused by conscious states. Though the entailment is argued for, only a few sketchy remarks support the main claim. Tononi appeals to the intuition that conscious agents are paradigms of freedom, and -- more persuasively, I think -- claims that the extent to which an action is caused by a conscious (and therefore informationally integrated) state is the extent to which it is sensitive to a broad range of factors. That would seem to entail, in turn, that an action caused by a conscious state issues from a mechanism that is sensitive to a broader range of reasons then one caused by a nonconscious state. But it would take further work to show that nonconscious states do not cause sufficiently reasons-responsive states: indeed, it is very likely that under some conditions they do.

Three papers, one in the section on neuroscience and two in the final section on the reconciliation of free will and science, are by people with a deep knowledge of the free will debate; obviously, they are not subject to the criticisms mentioned above. Robert Doyle presents the latest variant of his two-stage account of free will, which is closely akin to views sketched (though not endorsed) by Daniel Dennett and Alfred Mele. At the first stage, the alternatives between which we deliberate are indeterministically generated; at the second stage, we choose deterministically between them. This account succeeds in avoiding what Doyle calls predeterminism: its being the case that our actions are necessitated by facts (and laws) that date back prior to our existence. It does less well at satisfying the demand for alternative possibilities: on this account it is false that agents deliberate between metaphysically open alternatives. More importantly, I doubt that the account succeeds in avoiding the luck objection any better than rival event-causal libertarianisms. On this account, an agent who performs an act with a negative moral valence might have avoided performing an act with that valence only if an appropriate alternative (one without a negative valence and one with features sufficient deterministically to cause her to choose it) had featured among the alternatives generated by indeterministic processes. It will therefore be luck that explains the fact that she performed an act with that valence rather than one with a different valence. Elsewhere, I have claimed that defeating the luck objection requires showing that this contrastive fact is not due to luck. The other two papers by philosophers, Mele's critical discussion of Libet's experiments and Kane's overview of his influential event-causal libertarian view, achieve their aims admirably, though those acquainted with the work of these two important contributors to the free will debate will find little new in them.

Insofar as this book aims to show that free will is compatible with quantum physics -- this is a central claim of ten of the chapters of the book, and features heavily in both its introduction and the concluding overview -- it cannot be declared anything but a failure. The novel arguments are bad or nonexistent, best represented by Saurez's claim in the final overview chapter that quantum randomness just is "a particular case of free will". The papers that deeply engage with quantum physics do not demonstrate that quantum randomness is compatible with free will; they either assert their compatibility or simply identify the two. The much more careful chapters by philosophers are, of course, far better argued, but specialists will find little in them that they won't already be familiar with.

The book is most valuable for its overview of quantum physics, which is relatively clear and relatively accessible, and for its papers by people in the life sciences giving overviews of cutting edge work in their disciplines. The papers on quantum physics provide a glimpse into science which might help to constitute a genuine revolution in our understanding of the nature of reality. They also clearly illustrate the risks of building worldviews on the foundations of quantum physics. We may really need to countenance the possibility that our intuitions with regard to the nature of reality are systematically off base, but that does not license the speculation that consciousness is best explained by supposing that the mind is a receiver which picks up broadcasts from outside space-time (Staune), or Suarez's contention that free will and consciousness are either properties of elementary particles, or elementary particles are guided by a divine agency, either God or angels.

The editors of the book stress the importance of interdisciplinary work for progress on central problems in philosophy like the nature of consciousness and the existence of free will. I applaud the sentiment, but in many ways the book stands as an object lesson in the pitfalls of interdisciplinary work. Brilliance in one field does not guarantee, or even (on the evidence presented here) make it likely that someone's speculations outside the area of their expertise will be worth taking seriously. Good interdisciplinary work requires deep engagement with the fields into which one ventures, as well as the epistemic humility to recognize that one needs to learn from specialists in that field. Mele's discussion of Libet, the result of many years of reflection on the relevant science as well as very extensive reading in it and discussions with those who engage in it, is exemplary of such good interdisciplinary work. Too much of the rest of this volume illustrates the dangers of a failure to engage, with the requisite humility, with the areas into which one blunders.