Is Truth the Primary Epistemic Goal?

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Markus Patrick Hess, Is Truth the Primary Epistemic Goal?, Ontos, 2010, 165pp., €69.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380620.

Reviewed by Alan Millar, University of Stirling



The principal aim of this book is to defend an affirmative answer to the question that forms its title. Following an introductory chapter Hess examines, and finds wanting, arguments advanced by Rorty and Davidson against the idea that truth is an epistemic goal. He then considers in successive chapters what the value of truth consists in, what requirements derive from truth’s being an epistemic goal, why truth is the primary epistemic goal, why we should reject ‘alternative monisms’ about epistemic goals, and how to solve the value problem for knowledge that has its roots in Plato’s Meno. An appendix addresses the problem of epistemic relativism. Throughout the discussion it is assumed that we have a clear enough working idea of what epistemic goals are. In this respect, Hess does not differ from many philosophers who write on this topic. Yet the matter merits closer discussion than it generally receives. I take it that we are to understand what epistemic goals are in relation to epistemic evaluation. Epistemic evaluation, in turn, presumably includes applications of concepts like knowledge and justified belief. So the idea might be that epistemic goals are goods such that we epistemically evaluate beliefs (or enquiry?) in relation to the achievement of these goods.

Hess takes the claim that truth is an epistemic goal to entail that it is an epistemic ideal that we ‘believe the truth and only the truth’ (p. 35). Why an ideal rather than a definitely achievable goal? Hess says that ‘it is clear that the truth goal cannot be literally a goal as, for instance, a goal in a game, at which we aim in order to win’ (p. 35) but is not explicit as to why he thinks this is so. If I aim to find out where I left my keys, surely I aim to discern the truth about this matter. Is this not a goal at which I aim? As Hess observes, there are differences between ideals and actual practical goals, but I still wonder why he doubts that truth can literally be a goal at which we aim. It is a goal when I am looking for my keys. It is a goal attained when I find them.

Hess cites Nozick’s experience machine in support of the claim that we value truth for its own sake, irrespective of its practical value. The idea is that we prefer the real world to life on the machine; he suggests that ‘if we spurn the [life on the machine] because we want to have truth, then it must be that at some level we prefer truth on non-instrumental grounds’ (p. 53). He describes the thought-experiment inaccurately in suggesting that those on the machine have their desires fulfilled. They don’t or don’t in general. Rather, most of their desires — which might include desires for fulfilling personal relationships, satisfying careers, and so forth — are not actually satisfied, but only seem to be. But this is quibbling. Let us grant that it matters to us that our beliefs are not largely false. Does this show that we have the intuition that truth is valuable for its own sake? Well, if, when spelled out, the content of the intuition is, or entails, that it would be good for its own sake to believe all and only truths, then it is hard to see how the thought-experiment concerning the experience machine shows us to have such an intuition. At best it shows that we don’t want to be massively deceived about ourselves and our circumstances, even if our actual selves and circumstances are not conducive to the satisfaction of many of our desires.

When he turns to consider in more detail what it is for truth to be a regulative ideal Hess, who previously (p. 35) said that the truth goal involves believing the truth and only the truth, qualifies this claim with a view to characterizing more realistically what we actually value. The truth goal turns out to be that for all propositions p, we believe p if p is true and significant, and only if it is true (p. 73). I doubt whether this is significantly more realistic than the original because it fails to satisfy Hess’s own implied injunction against ‘supererogatory ideals that only gods could fulfil’ (p. 37). How are we supposed to come anywhere near to believing all significant truths? But a deeper worry is why we should expect there to be a goal that generates a plausible demand on all of us to believe everything in some indefinitely large class of truths. The following looks like a more plausible characterization of a truth goal: if you have a belief as to whether or not p, you believe that p if and only if p and believe that not-p if and only if not-p. This clearly has to do with believing truth and avoiding error but it generates no agent-neutral reason (in Thomas Nagel’s sense) to try to believe any particular class of truths, significant or otherwise. Rather, it generates an agent-relative reason: concerning those who have (or aspire to have) a belief in some matter, however significant or trivial, it says they have reason to try to ensure that they persist in that belief (or acquire it) if and only if it is true. Such a view is entirely silent on whether those of us who take no view on the matter ought to form a true belief concerning it.

Plausibly, the suggested view has to do with the very nature of belief, and yields one way of interpreting the metaphor that belief constitutively aims at truth. It is compatible with the claim that there are significant truths — perhaps deep truths concerning human life in general, or truths about oneself as an individual — such that no matter who you are there is reason to try to attain those truths. This further claim, however, does not seem to be grounded in the nature of belief. If it is grounded at all it is in wider considerations about goals worth having. The suggested view is also compatible with the view that it is a good thing that human beings collectively should expand human knowledge in matters of significance. But this further claim too, I suggest, would have to be supported by wider considerations about what is worth caring about. To answer the question whether these wider considerations pertain to what is of distinctively epistemic interest we would need a clearer conception of what such an interest amounts to.

Hess’s overall aim is to defend a form of epistemic value monism according to which the primary epistemic goal is truth. In his discussion of the value of knowledge he sets out to defend this monism against the charge that it is threatened because knowledge itself is clearly a distinct epistemic goal. An assumption of the problem is that knowledge constitutes an additional source of epistemic value distinct from, and not explicable solely in terms of, the value of truth, understood as the value of true belief. By contrast, Hess’s epistemic value monism is meant to account for the value of knowledge solely in terms of the value of true belief.

I find Hess’s discussion at this stage quite hard to follow. One strand in the argument (pp. 127-8) is presented as an explanation of how, consistently with the operative epistemic value monism, knowledge can have a higher epistemic value than true belief. Hess draws on Matt Weiner’s idea that the concept of knowledge serves to unite many useful epistemic functions to support the claim that the value of knowledge lies in its integrating several epistemic concepts, notably justified belief and truth. There are at least two problems here. First, Hess moves without comment between talking about the value of the concept of knowledge and talking of the value of knowledge. At the core of Weiner’s perspective is that the concept of knowledge is a convenient device for attributing standings some of which might be important in some contexts and others of which might be important in other contexts. Hence his analogy between the concept of knowledge and a Swiss Army knife that conveniently binds together tools that serve distinct functions. This view about the concept is compatible with the view that knowledge itself has no more value than, say, justified true belief, understood as falling short of knowledge, and that we care about knowledge only because in diverse contexts we care about one or other, or some combination, of the standings that knowledge incorporates. Second, Hess takes Weiner’s view to support the claim that knowledge can be comparatively more valuable than true belief, even if it lacks intrinsic value (here conceived as value for its own sake). But, again, the crucial problem was whether the value can be explained in terms of true belief and it has yet to be shown how this requirement is to be met.

There are other strands in Hess’s discussion of the value of knowledge, including a treatment of virtue-theoretic accounts. Hess takes these to be faulty. His criticisms of them do not help me to see why he takes himself to have shown that we can account for the value of knowledge in a manner that is consistent with his epistemic monism. At one point in the discussion of Ernest Sosa’s virtue theory he adduces an example (pp. 132-33) that, if I understand it aright, is taken to show that in practice people do not always care about whether a truth has been gained in an intellectually virtuous manner though they are prepared to pass it on, or receive it, as a truth. Why does Hess take this to pose a problem for virtue theory? Because Sosa (as quoted on p. 131) has said that ‘We prefer truth whose presence is the work of our intellect, truth that derives from our own virtuous performance [to] truth that is given to us by happenstance’. The idea here is that our preference is indicative of a value that we acknowledge. Hess’s objection is that his example illustrates that the claim made in the passage is false. However, a charitable reading of Sosa would take account of the fact that the passage quoted occurs in a context in which the issue is about rational preferences. It is open to the virtue theorist to take Hess’s example to illustrate the unsurprising fact that sometimes people are irrational in passing on or accepting truths, with little if any reflection on whether they have been virtuously acquired. Further, it is not even clear that the characters in Hess’s example have no actual preferences for virtuous belief-formation. For all we are told they might be deceiving themselves into thinking that they have obtained the truth in a virtuous way.

This book steers readers to many recent discussions of epistemic value and it highlights issues that deserve attention. My comments give some indication of why it leaves me dissatisfied.

I noticed that a quotation from Marian David on p. 121 does not accurately reproduce David’s text, because crucial words are left out. The error, which begins four lines from the bottom of the indented text, affects the sense of the passage and warrants the addition of an erratum slip.