Jürgen Habermas: Key Concepts

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Barbara Fultner (ed.), Jürgen Habermas: Key Concepts, Acumen Press, 2011, 264pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652372.

Reviewed by David Ingram, Loyola University Chicago


Anyone who has read Habermas knows how daunting his writing can be. Aside from the notorious density and abstractness of his prose, there is the challenge posed by the sheer scope of his undertaking. Quite simply, he stands out among our great contemporary thinkers for having dared to write a system of philosophy that crosses both disciplinary and thematic boundaries. In addition to this challenge, his thought has undergone several major permutations and countless minor ones over the past half century, as evidenced by the thirty some odd books and collections he has authored.

So we are truly fortunate that Acumen chose to include a book on Habermas in its exceptional Key Concepts series. These volumes are designed to provide synoptic introductions to important thinkers. This volume, edited by the well-known Habermas translator and scholar, Barbara Fultner, is a fine addition to the series. The essays included in this volume are written by eminent specialists in their respective fields, many of whom studied with Habermas. They are uniformly of high quality, and most are written at a level that upper-division undergraduates should find accessible. Furthermore, although most of them present a sympathetic case for Habermas's ambitious undertaking, they do not shy away from noting potential weaknesses. In short, this is about as complete an account of Habermas's social philosophy as one might possibly expect from a modestly sized volume.

The best way to appreciate the merits of the volume is to go directly to its Table of Contents. With the exception of Fultner's fine introduction, in which she deftly summarizes the evolution of Habermas's thought through four stages, and Max Pensky's nicely written essay situating Habermas's post-metaphysical enterprise within its historical and intellectual context, the volume's eleven chapters fall under three headings that are arranged in a kind of logical order. The first heading, on communicative rationality, addresses the basic methodological and conceptual foundation of Habermas's system. This section begins with Melissa Yates's reflections on Habermas's post-metaphysical style of philosophical thinking. Yates observes that, unlike many philosophers, Habermas refuses to assign his philosophy any privileged epistemic status above or prior to the empirical sciences. This serves as a corrective to those who mistakenly believe that Habermas is a transcendental philosopher in the Kantian vein. At the same time, Habermas reserves a unique role for philosophy as a kind of placeholder or guardian for the most basic normative presuppositions underlying distinctly modern forms of life, whose abstract, rule-like competencies it seeks to "reconstruct" with the aid of the sciences. This latter endeavor requires that philosophy mediate interpretatively the sciences and our common-sense understanding of what it is that we do whenever we act, communicate, argue with one another, reason morally, and the like. In this way, Habermas's notion of philosophy defends -- in a weakly transcendental way, with the aid of an equally weak naturalism -- claims about universal normative assumptions to which we must all appeal if we are to make sense of our speech action, argumentative practice, and modes of moral, ethical, and legal deliberation.

With Habermas's post-metaphysical understanding of philosophy under our belt, we are led, in the next three chapters, to explore the three most central -- and arguably the most difficult and problematic -- foundational concepts of Habermas's system. Chapter Three, written by Fultner, very clearly and succinctly lays out the basic contours of Habermas's formal pragmatic account of linguistic meaning and the theory of communicative action in which it is embedded. This is quite a tall order, as it requires Fultner to discuss a large number of competing theories of meaning (formal semantic, intentional, inferential, speech act) as well as accounts of action (strategic and communicative). Not only does Fultner manage to situate Habermas within these traditions, but she also manages to squeeze in a discussion of Habermas's distinction between truth and moral rightness, which serves as his riposte to moral realists. In general, her essay sympathetically lays out the basic contours of Habermas's philosophy of language without delving too much into its potential weaknesses.

Chapter Four, written by Joseph Heath, elaborates this conceptual foundation in a higher, somewhat more concrete register: Habermas's notoriously elusive distinction between lifeworld and system. Heath does an excellent job of tracing Habermas's tripartite structural analysis of the lifeworld in terms of personality, society, and culture as well as his conception of system back to Talcott Parson's seminal work on the action system, which Habermas continued to develop into a full-blown structural functionalist account consisting of various self-regulating, media-steered systems. Heath notes that Habermas's attempt to bridge lifeworld and system, viz., to show how the "system" of communicative action gives rise to self-regulating cybernetic action systems of economy and legal administration remains incomplete. Furthermore, he observes that the appeal to functionalist imperatives may not be necessary in order to explain what Habermas wants to explain: the failure of the welfare state to manage social conflicts, including and especially conflicts that assume a non-class form.

The concluding chapter of this section, written by Joel Anderson, addresses an aspect of Habermas's thought that tends to be ignored by commentators: his account of autonomy, agency, and the self. Anderson's discussion of authenticity represents an especially pertinent contribution, for he nimbly navigates the complexities of accounting for the "inauthenticity of selective self-examination" from the somewhat counter-intuitive standpoint of intersubjective critique, wherein others contribute to our self-identity. Here he detects three strands of such an account: the intersubjectivity of value clarification, the suppression of facts about one's past; and the importance of vouching for oneself to others in confessions and autobiographies. Again, this essay is largely a defense of the advantages offered by discursive intersubjectivity in explicating the autonomy and identity of subjects.

Part II, on moral and political theory, begins where Anderson leaves off. William Rehg's account of Habermas's discourse ethic reformulates in condensed form Rehg’s classic book on this subject. The essay begins by examining the metaethical aspects of this ethic, including Habermas's attempt to defend the principle of universalizability (U) against skeptical counters. After impressively reconstructing this argument, which adduces (U) from assumptions regarding both the content and rules of moral discussion, Rehg turns to the importance of real discourse as a medium for justifying and applying norms. He concludes this discussion with an exemplary treatment of the distinction between ethics and morality, which in turn refers back to and builds upon Anderson's account of authentic personal identity.

Because the egalitarian and consensual assumptions underlying concerted efforts at practical reasoning are only formally approximated in institutional settings, for the last twenty years Habermas has focused on exploring the ways in which the normative principle of discourse (D) underwrites and informs democratic and legal institutions. Kevin Olsen's fine discussion of this very complicated topic in Chapter Seven specifically addresses Habermas's system of legal rights and his two-tiered model of democratic deliberation. Olsen's overall sympathetic treatment raises questions regarding Habermas's underestimating the theoretical centrality of social rights in his system in comparison to classical property, contract, civil, and political rights. Turning from rights to democracy, Olsen takes note of the innovations and limitations of Habermas's two-tiered deliberative model of democracy (reflecting Bernhard Peters's "sluice" model of political core and periphery), in which informal political exchanges in the public sphere are allocated responsibility for publicizing on-going social concerns and formal parliamentary discussions are tailored to decision based on consensus and compromise. In Olsen's opinion, the normative innovation of the theory (its grounding of the primacy of egalitarian, consensual democratic deliberation) is limited by the non-egalitarian and, to some extent, non-discursive and non-deliberative factual political reality it is supposed to critically reconstruct and describe.

The following chapter by Christopher Zurn addresses the other half of Habermas's theory of law and democracy: the sociology of law and the theory of adjudication. Zurn begins by pointing out the central ("transmission belt") role that law plays as both functional steering medium, replacing communicatively achieved social integration with norm-free systemic integration, and as normative institution, anchoring the legitimacy of administration and economy. Zurn notes that Habermas's understanding of law's dual nature has evolved since the eighties; where he once sought to derive the normative force of law directly from moral ideas of justice, he now insists on the strict separation of law and morality. However, despite this concession to positivism, Habermas's emphatic coupling of legality and legitimacy, rule of law and deliberative democracy, and private autonomy and public autonomy, provides both conceptual and functional links between law as a factual steering medium and law as a normative institution grounded in (D).

Zurn's concluding discussion of Habermas's theory of adjudication nicely correlates the horizontal and vertical separation of powers, as Habermas understands it, with his theory of discourse types. As Habermas understands it, legislative discourses principally revolve around the justification of general norms, while judicial discourses principally revolve around the application of norms to individual cases. Zurn observes, however, that this neat distinction is not absolute, since executive, legislative, and judicial bodies often are forced to entertain a variety of pragmatic, judicial, normative, and ethical discourses -- all of which threatens the separation of powers and the legitimate constitutional flow of "communicative power" from public sphere, to legislature, judiciary, and executive. Habermas's discourse theoretical appropriation of Dworkin's hermeneutical theory of "law as integrity" and his appeal to the role of public hearings and public opinion at all levels of formal deliberation offers a partial solution to this problem, while his insistence on a reasonable expectation in procedural justice rebuts the concerns voiced by legal realists and other skeptics regarding the impact of arbitrary power on decision-making. Having noted some important challenges by legal skeptics, Zurn's critical treatment of what is perhaps the most controversial aspect of Habermas's political theory remains somewhat subdued -- and necessarily so, given limits of space.

The three concluding chapters that compose Part III address Habermas's most recent research on international law, religion, and social movements. Keith Haysom's essay on civil society and social movements studies the evolution of Habermas's understanding of civil society and the public sphere from the Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere (1962) to Between Facts and Norms (1992). While Habermas's deep involvement with the student movement and debates concerning social democracy, civil rights, and social justice find prominence in the earlier writings, a notable shift occurs in the early eighties, when his attention is drawn toward environmentalism, feminism, and other social movements that are less oriented toward the classical struggle for social justice and civil rights than toward the "grammar" and "integrity" of the lifeworld. Along with this shift we note a corresponding change in Habermas's understanding of civil society, away from the Hegelian and Marxian conception of a private sphere of economic producers and consumers to a more classical conception of a public political sphere geared toward the generation and dissemination of public opinion. Remaining constant throughout this change is Habermas's interest in civil disobedience, which he later defends as indispensable to progressive constitutional reform. In the final analysis Haysom wonders whether this optimistic faith in "radical reformism," with its distrust of totalizing, revolutionary movements of any political stripe, doesn't concede too much power and authority to the inherently conservative core of the legal system.

Ciaran Cronin's chapter on cosmopolitan democracy does a magnificent job of condensing an enormously complicated issue in Habermas's on-going research. The challenge Habermas poses for himself here is truly daunting: to retranslate Kant's vision of cosmopolitan governance to a contemporary world in thrall to globalization. Rejecting both classical political realism, with its assimilation of international "law" to voluntary agreements reflecting a transient balance of power, and classical moral idealism, with its insistence on a top-down imposition of order from an enlightened world state, Habermas proposes a tri-level model of cosmopolitan democracy that concedes a little to both of these extremes. On one hand, global security, economic, and environmental challenges have outstripped the administrative capacities of nation states to such an extent that such states must abandon any claim to absolute sovereignty and self-determination. Given the impact of economic globalization on migration, nation states must learn to embrace a multicultural identity centered on loyalty to liberal democratic constitutional principles ("constitutional patriotism") rather than on any thick identity. While retaining control over some domestic policies (education, for example), they must cede control in other areas.

Most importantly, they must cede control to a United Nations, whose General Assembly and Security Council have been restructured in accordance with principles of democratic representation (combining popular representation of groups as well as of states and larger political federations), in protecting basic human rights. Moreover, they must cede partial control of global economic and environmental policy to a network of intermediary bodies (global economic multilaterals, such as the World Bank and the World Trade Organization, as well as regional bodies). Because this "supranational" level of governance touches on political questions of distributive justice ("world domestic policy") for which any established consensus is lacking, the multilateral treaties negotiated at this level will inevitably reflect compromises. It is precisely for this very reason that the nation state will retain its necessary function of providing democratic legitimacy "of last resort." Cronin concludes by raising a number of problems with Habermas's attempt to extend his "monistic" account of law and democracy to the international arena, since one may wonder whether the "indirect" manner of democratic legitimacy provided by a weak global public sphere and the national election of foreign diplomats will meet the rigorous demands of cosmopolitan justice as Habermas understands it.

The final chapter by Eduardo Mendieta beautifully recounts Habermas's continuing efforts to rethink his theory of rationalization, secularization, and modernity. The choice to conclude this volume with a discussion of religion is especially appropriate insofar as Habermas has recently emphasized the limits of rational moral and legal systems in providing motivation for social justice reform movements. Religion anchors commitment to distinctly ethical values and utopian goals within solidaristic forms of life, and this commitment seems unsurpassable even in modern, secularized societies -- hence Habermas's affirmation, against militant strands of atheistic secularism, of a "post-secular" society. Mendieta does an excellent job in situating Habermas's life-long fascination with theological motifs, beginning with his dissertation on Schelling and the Jewish sources of German Idealism and continuing through his later dialogue with Bloch, Benjamin, and other thinkers associated with the Frankfurt School. He then shows how Habermas's own belief that secularization undermines religious faith -- a conviction he held as late as the early eighties -- gradually gave way to an opposing assessment. Central to this evolution is Habermas's endorsement of Karl Jaspers's theory that modern deontological ideas concerning the inherent dignity of the individual, the value of caring community, and the importance of social justice have their roots in the great religious awakening of the Axial Age. For Habermas, this link -- so essential to the messianic roots of critical theory extending back to Marx -- must be respected even by non-believers in civil political discourse; the burden they share of having to "translate" the insights of religion into a neutral, secular idiom corresponds to the burden that believers shoulder in reconciling their beliefs to the modern idiom of science and universal morality.

Having concluded my all-too-brief summary of this outstanding collection of essays, I would like to end on a cautionary note. No volume can capture all the intricacies of a thinker as complicated as Habermas. It is to their credit that the contributors to the present volume have scrupulously informed the reader of what their accounts have left out. Left out are Habermas's extensive writings on knowledge, truth, science, rationality, and technology (both from Knowledge and Human Interests and Truth and Justification); psychoanalytic ideology-critique and systematically distorted communication; and legal paradigms. Also left out are significant references to Habermas's fascinating studies on central figures in sociology and philosophy. That said, this volume will likely remain a standard source for students of Habermas, who will appreciate its overall evenhandedness and comprehensiveness.