J. S. Mill: Moral, Social and Political Thought

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Dale E. Miller, J. S. Mill: Moral, Social and Political Thought, Polity Press, 2010, 252pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745625843.

Reviewed by Henry R. West, Macalester College


This is an excellent book. John Stuart Mill was the most important British philosopher of the nineteenth century. He made important contributions to every field of philosophy: logic, metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, political philosophy, aesthetics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language, economic and social philosophy, and whatever I haven't listed. A general book on J. S. Mill cannot encompass all of Mill's contributions to philosophy and to the history of ideas. Dale E. Miller's book limits itself, as its subtitle indicates, to Mill's moral, social and political thought. Within that limit it is very comprehensive, well documented with quotations from Mill and secondary literature, and carefully analytical.

After an introductory section on Mill's life and his "understanding of human nature" that describes his empiricism, his psychological theory of "associationism," his belief in innate sympathy, and his account of the origin of our moral feelings, the book is divided roughly in half between Mill's moral philosophy and his social and political philosophy.

Part II, on Mill's moral philosophy, has chapters on Mill's "Proof" of the principle of utility, Mill's claim that there are "higher pleasures," and a chapter on whether Mill is an act- or rule-utilitarian, concluding with a section on Mill's theory of justice. Part III, on Mill's social and political thought, has a chapter on Mill's On Liberty, a chapter on Mill's normative economic views, and a chapter on Mill's views on democracy. Part IV has Concluding Remarks.

In the first half of this volume dealing with Mill's moral philosophy, Miller provides insightful analysis. He recognizes that Mill is not a simple maximizing act-utilitarian, a position often identified as utilitarian from the influence of Henry Sidgwick, G. E. Moore, and J. J. C. Smart. Mill holds a complex conception of morality, in many respects analogous to a legal system. In spite of his formula in Utilitarianism, "actions are right as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to promote the reverse of happiness," Miller recognizes that this does not make Mill's moral theory a form of maximizing act-utilitarianism. Morality is one division of the "Art of Life," which includes the "departments" of "Morality, Prudence or Policy, and Aesthetics; the Right, the Expedient, and the Beautiful or Noble, in human conduct and works" (quoted on p. 81). Morality is limited to actions that deserve punishment of some sort, if not legal or social then the condemnation of an individual's conscience. Thus Miller correctly interprets Mill as some sort of rule utilitarian. Mill's conception of rights constitutes a subset of these "auxiliary" rules for carrying out the utilitarian goal of greatest long term utility.

In the chapter on Mill's "proof," Miller answers the criticisms that Mill commits simple-minded fallacies of equivocation and composition and that in the proof he deserts his hedonism. Although Miller thinks that Mill does not express himself clearly, Miller reconstructs the proof so that it meets these criticisms. It is in this chapter, and the following one on "The Higher Pleasures," that this reviewer believes that Miller has a serious misinterpretation of Mill. This issue is Mill's conception of pleasure and pain. Miller, following L. W. Sumner, makes a distinction between an "internalist" and an "externalist" conception of pleasure and pain. The first view takes pleasure to be one specific and distinctive feeling which is present in all pleasurable experiences. The second says that any subjective experience can be a pleasure if we have the right kind of favorable attitude towards the experience, such as a desire of that feeling for its own sake. The fallacy in this dichotomy is that the description of internalism does not recognize the varieties of pleasure and pain.

The critics of Mill, such as G. E. Moore and Sidgwick, claim that if pleasure is one specific feeling, then it is impossible to claim that some kinds of pleasure are better than others, as Mill does in his theory of qualitatively superior pleasures. But it is a mistake to claim that pleasure is one specific feeling. Pleasure is a genus with many specific varieties, with "family resemblances" that make them all species of pleasure. This is clear in the case of pains. There is a difference between a stomach ache, a headache, and a sore ankle, but they are all pains. They feel different not only in their location but also in the way they hurt. A bee sting is a stinging pain. A tooth ache is an aching pain. But they are all pains. They are appropriately called pains because they bear family resemblances to each other. They are more like each other than they are like other experiences called by different names. This is also true of less physical pains, such as the pains of the sense of loss or grief or the pain of frustration. They feel different as pains, not just in the source of the pains. The same is true of pleasures. Examples are Mill's higher pleasures, such as the aesthetic pleasures of art or beauty, and the physical pleasures of eating when hungry. They are all pleasures because they, as phenomena, differ as different pleasures, not just as different non-hedonic experiences that we desire. Mill was an introspective psychologist. When he says that pleasures are not homogeneous, he is referring to the different phenomenal experiences that we count as pleasures. Pleasures of the mind are different from pleasures of the body in the way they feel as pleasures. They may all be desired, but we can ask, are they pleasures because they are desired, or are they desired because they are felt pleasures?

In Mill's proof, he evidently believes that the experience of pleasure and the experience of desire are two different aspects of experiences that we find, through "practiced self-consciousness and self-observation," to be correlated. If pleasure were simply desire for a subjective experience for its own sake, the "proof" would be trivial. Miller seems to admit this: "If we define a pleasure as a subjective experience desired for its own sake, then the proposition that pleasure is desired is true by definition" (p. 48). Miller struggles to avoid this conclusion, but it is a stretch. He also has no adequate account of the masochist: if pain is not a phenomenal pain but an aversion to a non-hedonic experience, then the masochist does not really feel pain. Miller might say that there is an aversion to the experience toward which there is also a desire, and that the desire outweighs the aversion. But a more natural way to describe it is to say that there is a feeling of pain, and there is pleasure in feeling it. And it is not just the masochist for whom Miller's analysis is inadequate. An athlete in training may like the soreness of muscles because he or she knows that it is a sign of a good workout. There is pain in the muscles, but there is no aversion to it. We can ask the question that Socrates asked Euthyphro about the gods and piety: do we feel pleasure and pain only because we have desires and aversions or do we have desires and aversions to these experiences because they are pleasures and pains? I find that I desire pleasures because they feel good. It isn't simply that they feel good because I desire them.

In sum, if the internalist interpretation recognizes that there are different kinds of pleasures and pains, and that these differences in kind are based on the differences in the feelings of the pleasures and pains themselves, not a desire for different kinds of experiences that are not in themselves phenomenally pleasures and pains, Mill's proof and his distinction between qualitatively higher pleasures are much easier to interpret. With this qualification, Miller's analysis of Mill's proof and distinction in qualities of pleasure is convincing. In fact, he first interprets Mill's proof assuming an internalist account and then struggles to reinterpret it with an externalist account.

Part III, on Mill's social and political philosophy is very comprehensive and includes detailed analysis of controversies concerning such topics as the "harm" principle in On Liberty and Mill's complicated attitude toward universal suffrage. It also fortunately includes a chapter on Mill's "Normative Political Economy," a topic that is often neglected by philosophers writing on Mill.

Mill was the leading analytical economist of his day. His Principles of Political Economy was the foremost text in the field. But he also had normative views. The chapters on property in his Political Economy are highly critical of capitalism. They discuss the advantages and disadvantages of socialism, the socialism advocated by the so-called "utopian" socialists -- Robert Owen, Fourier, Louis Blanc, and the Saint Simonians. Mill did not know of Marx, and he dismissed out of hand the revolutionary socialists that he knew of. In his Autobiography, Mill says that he and Harriet came to a view that would classify them "under the general designation of Socialists" (quoted on p. 162). Mill advocated the nationalization of natural resources, with compensation for current owners, and he proposed limitations on rights of inheritance. Miller has a good review of Mill's attitudes toward capitalism and socialism.

In the chapter on "Mill on Liberty and Individuality," Miller has an exhaustive analysis of what Mill meant by his principle of liberty, including an in depth analysis of alternative views of the "harm principle." Miller finds no clear textual interpretation, but provides a reconstruction that is quite plausible.

In the chapter on "Millian Democracy," Miller gives some idea of Mill's complex assessment of universal suffrage and representative government. Mill advocated votes for women. He was a pioneer by introducing a bill in Parliament to give women the right to vote equal to men (which failed to pass but called important attention to the issue), and he advocated votes for the working classes. However, he had an ambivalent attitude toward the wisdom of that policy, in light of the illiteracy and inadequate education of most poor people. Miller explores Mill's efforts to find solutions to mitigate that problem, including Mill's proposal that people have multiple votes based on their educational achievements.

Miller's book is sympathetic to Mill, giving him as charitable a reading as possible, but it is not uncritical. On some issues he finds it difficult to make out a consistent interpretation, and on some issues he leaves the question of interpretation open. For all Mill scholars as well as the general reader, this volume is highly recommended.