Jean-Luc Nancy and the Thinking of Otherness: Philosophy and Powers of Existence

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Daniele Rugo, Jean-Luc Nancy and the Thinking of Otherness: Philosophy and Powers of Existence, Bloomsbury, 2013, 210pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780936109.

Reviewed by François Raffoul, Louisiana State University


This is a rich and brilliant study of Jean-Luc Nancy's thought, bringing to the fore his relation with other thinkers, in particular Heidegger and Levinas. Daniele Rugo proposes to interpret Nancy's work in light of his appropriation of Heidegger's thought, and seeks to "investigate to what extent the Heideggerian project motivates Nancy's writing," so as to reveal "the creative frictions between the two thinkers" (p. 1). The author performs this task through expert readings, comparing and contrasting Heidegger's and Nancy's thinking with respect to the motifs of the body, the world, and the with. The conceptual focus of such confrontation ultimately centers on the notion of "being-with," a key term that Nancy borrowed from Heidegger's analysis of Mitsein in Being and Time, and further elaborated in his work on community, on our being-in-common or co-existence.

A ccording to Rugo, this debate between Nancy and Heidegger requires "the presence of [a] third interlocutor," namely Emmanuel Levinas (p. 1). The reason given for such necessity is that Levinas has "engaged" with "questions of otherness and sociality" and, because of that, "one has the impression that [Nancy's] 'return' to Heidegger with regard to the themes of sociality and otherness works as a response and critique to Levinas' radically anti-Heideggerian position" (p. 1). Further, Rugo's ultimate thesis in this book is that Nancy's work is able to reintroduce "otherness," a category borrowed from Levinas, into Heidegger's thought on being. As he writes, "Where Levinas affirms that the recurrence to Being is a threat posed to alterity, Nancy insists that alterity lies at the heart of Being" (p. 141). Further, he writes that Nancy understands the "with" "as the site of the openness of existence to the work of otherness" (p. 167). Therefore, it is suggested, Nancy's appropriation of Heidegger could be seen as a reopening or reintroduction of Levinasian themes within Heidegger's corpus. At the same time, Rugo recognizes that "Jean-Luc Nancy never explicitly engages with the work of Levinas" (p. 1) and that his approach goes counter to Levinas's positioning of an absolute other. Indeed, Nancy is suspicious of the very category of the other, of otherness, which renders problematic the assertion that "Nancy's conception of the co-essentiality of Being and Being-with opens the question of otherness within Being and at the heart of existence" (p. 1). I will wonder whether Nancy's radicalization of Heidegger's Being-with needs to go through Levinas's thematization of the Other. More broadly, I will question the limits of this suggested reference to Levinas -- and to the category of otherness -- to understand Nancy's relation to Heidegger.

The book follows three threads: 1) The question of the body, understood as the exposure of Dasein's existence; 2) The problem of the world, as the site of sense as happening "between us"; 3) The motif of the "with," taken as the opening of otherness in existence and sense. It is accordingly structured in three main parts, followed by a concluding chapter. Chapter 1, "Exposures," is devoted to the question of the body in Nancy's thought, and how it plays, via Spinoza, between him and Heidegger. Nancy is said to elaborate the question of the body by pursuing what Heidegger had left undeveloped, although still drawing from Heidegger's thought of existence. As Rugo puts it, "Nancy endeavours to re-open the question of the body from within Heidegger, which in a few words means to link the body most explicitly with the question of an existence without essence" (p. 16). A certain debt is acknowledged towards Heidegger: although Rugo states that "Heidegger does not speak about the body" (p. 11) (an excessive statement considering Heidegger's extensive elaborations on the body, for instance in the Zollikon seminars, but also in later essays, to which the author actually refers and discusses later in this chapter), he also recognizes that "Heidegger attempts to liberate the body from its metaphysical 'history': the body is not a substance, but a particular way of existing in the world" (p. 13). The author shows convincingly that Nancy's account of the body pursues this interpretation and indeed "takes up much of Heidegger's argument in refusing to consider the body as mere extension" (p. 17). Rugo then attempts at the end of the chapter to connect Nancy's thinking of the body with Levinas, through a reference to the latter's notion of "position" in his early works. Although intriguing, this comparison is less convincing, perhaps because, for Levinas, "position" or "hypostasis" referred to the position of a subjectivity emerging from the impersonal "there is," a position that would ultimately be overcome by the interruption of the other, which is a conceptual situation that has no parallel in Nancy.

Chapter 2, "Between Us," focuses on Nancy's thinking of "world," in particular in The Creation of the World or Globalization.[1] Rugo shows how Nancy's thought of the world arises out of a deconstruction of the onto-theological tradition, revealing the world as groundless, that is, as no longer "dependent from an external principle" (p. 8). This point is made by referring to Heidegger's critique of the "principle of sufficient reason" in The Principle of Reason (pp. 82-86).[2] The world has no why; it is not founded on some transcendent principle beyond itself, but rather exists from itself. The world does not have an outside and thus does not get crossed over; rather, it is traversed: from beginning to end, from one edge to another, but never in order to access an outside or a beyond. "A world is traversed from one edge to the other, and nothing else. It never crosses over these edges to occupy a place overlooking itself" (CW, 43). The world is not of the order of substance, of support or basis: the world does not presuppose itself; it exists as an extension of itself, as gap from itself, without ground or against the background of nothing. It is as such self-referentiality that the world makes sense: "One could say that worldhood (mondialité) is the symbolization of the world, the way in which the world symbolizes in itself with itself, in which it articulates itself by making a circulation of meaning possible without reference to another world" (CW, 53). The world only refers to itself, and thus "the meaning of the world does not occur as a reference to some outside of the world."Rather, it "circulates," Nancy tells us, "between all those who stand in it [s'y tiennent], each time singular and singularly sharing a same possibility that none of them, anyplace or any God outside of this world, accomplishes" (CW, 43). The world happens between us. This leads Rugo to investigate in a third chapter the question of the "with," which has thus been reopened from such an a-theological world, before in the conclusion developing what he calls the "powers of existence" understood both as Nancy's insistence on the open and on the incommensurability of such openness.

It is in chapter 3, "Separations," that Levinas is brought into the debate most decisively, leading Rugo to make a series of interpretive gestures that may come into question. As these claims or assumptions constitute the core of the argument, let us examine them specifically. The author's conviction is that it is "Levinas' refusal of Heidegger's Being-in-the World [that] constitutes the point of departure to develop the dialogue between Levinas, Heidegger and Nancy" (p. 8). Now, as one knows, Levinas rejects being-in-the-world because more authentic than the care and concern of a being-in-the-world is the "relation with the transcendent" (cited on p. 112). However, Nancy rejects the reference to the transcendent and instead attempts to radicalize further Heidegger's notion of being-in-the-world in terms of an a-theological understanding of the event of the world. In addition, Levinas rejects Heidegger's being-in-the-world in the name of an otherness that comes to "interrupt" my everyday dealings with the world. Yet, Nancy does not appeal to such exteriority of the other as transcendence to the world, and in fact attempts to remain with the "everyday," rethought as the each day of a singular existence. No appeal is made to the existence of an Other beyond this world, which is the very gesture of onto-theology. For Nancy, the world is no longer referred to a transcendence, to a beyond, to a god outside the world and distinct from the world; in short, the world no longer refers to another world. Nancy writes: "Whoever speaks of 'the world' renounces any appeal to 'another world' or a 'beyond-the-world' [outre-monde]" (CW, 37). The world is not "in" something other than itself.

If there is an "other" in Nancy's thinking of the world, it is an other that the world itself is, in the sense in which it manifests an inappropriable (the world happens each time without foundation and without reason). Thus Nancy writes that "the 'outside' of the world must be open 'within it' -- but open in a way that no other world could be posited there." (CW, 52). Nancy does not refer the event of the world to an Other, but instead to the disjunction of an "ex," to a "dislocation" (p. 42). What remains inappropriable in the event of the world is not so much the existence of an other than the presence of a gap, a spacing, a différance (the "with," Nancy explains, is "unpresentable," but it is not unpresentable like some remote or withdrawn presence, or like an Other). The world is a dis-posing openness, the spacing of singularities, and in the ex nihilo of the creation of the world, only the ex remains. That "ex" is a distributive, the dis-position of the appearing, and creation is nothing but the ex-position of being as singular plural. The "with" reveals, not an otherness, but a case vide, an "empty slot," the dis- of disposition, the cum- of com-position, a gap or void without any substantiality or integrity of its own, the sheer nothing of a between. There is no Other for Nancy, only the between.

To that extent, the claim of a proximity between Levinas and Nancy around this motif of otherness seems fragile to me. A clarification may be required here about the difference between a thinking of the "with" and a thinking of otherness. Rugo tends to conflate them, for instance on page 125, where we read that "Nancy's reading is close to Heidegger in linking the question of the world to that of Being-with and otherness" (my emphasis); on page 185, we also read that "Existence demands to be essentially open to the other, to the otherness over which it casts its eventual decision." However, being-with is not synonymous with otherness. In fact, we must note that Levinas takes issue with the category of the "with," that is, with Heidegger's Mitsein, in the name of a more authentic thinking of otherness. Indeed, he considers that the "with" is an inadequate category to capture the authentic relation to the other, which is not a being-together in a shared world, but lies in an encounter in the face to face of a relation without intermediary and without mediation.For Levinas, being-with precisely does not give access to the otherness of the other. Why? First, because it is precisely in such being-with that Dasein "begins to identify with the Being of all others and understand itself from the impersonal anonymity of the They, to lose itself in averageness or to fall under the dictatorship of the They";[3] in sum, to be inauthentic. The fact that Heidegger identifies the inauthenticity of Dasein with Being-with is significant. In fact, for Levinas this springs from "Heidegger's very philosophical project," in which "the relation to the other is conditioned by being in the world, and thus by ontology". Being-with is a negation of otherness. Heidegger indeed understands the other as being-with, as being-together. But this "with" and its reciprocity is still in one sense neutral, or a middle term. Being-with is a communion around something in common. Now for Levinas the relation to the other is "not a communion." That would reproduce a logic of the same, which is why Levinas considers being-with to be a negation of otherness: "We hope to show, for our part, that the proposition with [mit] is unable and inapt to express the original relation with the other."[4]

Inversely, it is striking to note that Nancy rejects the category of the other in the name of a more authentic thinking of the "with"! Indeed, Rugo recognizes that Nancy seeks to give thought to "an originary with" (p. 138). If the "with" becomes the primordial "element," as Nancy insists, one should no longer think it either on the basis of the one, or on the basis of the other, or on the basis of their union (at times understood as the one, at times as the other). Otherwise, one would still be conceiving matters as starting from the identity of an I that enters into a relation with an other (p. 191). Rather, one should think their relation "absolutely and without reservations on the basis of the with."[5]

This is the occasion for Nancy to distance himself from the very category of the "Other," including in its contemporary formulations, whether in Lacan or in Levinas. Nancy does admit that the category of the other, which "haunts" contemporary thought, represents the intuition of the "incommensurability of being as being-with-one-another" (ESP, 100). On this point, Rugo is quite correct in noting their proximity when he writes that "The fact that the with remains incommensurable guarantees the opening towards the other that Levinas was seeking to address" (p. 9). Nonetheless, Nancy is interested in thinking otherness on the basis of incommensurability and not the inverse, because "otherness" conceals the regime of the "with." Nancy's critique of the very category of the other is unambiguous: there is not an "other" of the world and of existence. To posit an Other is still to posit an identity, however remote. All there is is the singular-plural essence of existence, of singularities: neither "the Other, nor the others, but a singular-plural" (ESP, 69). Nancy rejects the opposition or face-to-face between an I and an other, as this posits both as constituted identities. Instead, both the I and the other are divided as singularities. The others are "a primordial plurality which co-appears" (ESP, 89-90). In addition, Nancy does not confine the co-existence of singularities to an anthropological horizon, in contrast with Levinas, for whom the other is always the other human being. The "other" (the lowercase other) is one among all. Thus, "The issue is not so much about an Other (inevitably a "capitalized Other") than the world, the issue is about the alterity, or alteration, of the world" (ESP, 29). The "Other," according to Nancy, is a "theological" notion, a "theologizing residue" (ESP, 65). With respect to Levinas, explicitly criticized in these pages, Nancy asserts firmly: "What [Levinas] understands as 'otherwise than Being' should precisely be understood as 'what is most proper to Being,' precisely because the issue is to think being-with rather than the opposition between the other and Being" (ESP, 52, n. 1).

It appears that Nancy's thought develops in a way that is foreign to Levinas' categories, attempting instead to radicalize Heidegger's ontology into an ontology of the singular-plural and of the between (Nancy indeed declares at the beginning of Being Singular Plural that he is engaging in a work of fundamental ontology), and not staging a face to face with a transcendence, as Levinas does. The emphasis on being-with and the attempt to develop an ontology of being-with reveals Nancy's debt to Heidegger, not to Levinas.

Nonetheless, even if one is not entirely convinced by the passage through Levinas to understand Nancy's relation to Heidegger, the book remains a brilliant discussion of Nancy's thinking, provocative and imaginative, well-researched and rich. It certainly deserves to be a reference for anyone who wants to explore further Nancy's work.

[1] Jean-Luc Nancy. The Creation of the World or Globalization, translated by François Raffoul and David Pettigrew (Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 2007). Hereafter cited as CW, followed by page number.

[2] Martin Heidegger. The Principle of Reason, translated by Reginald Lilly (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1996).

[3] Emmanuel Levinas, Entre Nous, translated by Michael B. Smith and Barbara Harshav (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998), p. 210.

[4] Emmanuel Levinas, Le Temps et l’autre (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1983), p. 19.

[5] Jean-Luc Nancy. Etre Singulier Pluriel (Paris: Galilée, 1996), pp. 54-55. Hereafter cited as ESP. Translations mine.