Jesus and Philosophy: New Essays

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Paul K. Moser (ed.), Jesus and Philosophy: New Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 236pp., $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521694865.

Reviewed by Michael Rea, University of Notre Dame


Jesus and Philosophy is motivated, so the Preface tells us, by the following question: "What, if anything, does Jesus of Nazareth, the founder of the Christian movement, have to do with philosophy?" Following the editorial introduction, the book falls into three parts:

I. Jesus in His First Century Thought Context

II. Jesus and Medieval Philosophy

III. Jesus in Contemporary Philosophy

The first three essays in Part I, as well as the first two essays in Part III, are written by theologians -- Craig A. Evans, James Crenshaw, Luke Timothy Johnson, William J. Abraham, and David Ford. Evans and Johnson are best known for their work in New Testament studies, Crenshaw for his work on Old Testament wisdom literature, and Abraham and Ford for their work in contemporary Christian thought. Paul Gooch, most of whose work lies at the intersection of philosophy and biblical studies, contributes the final essay in part I. The remaining essays are written by philosophers whose work will already be known to most of those reading this review -- Gareth Matthews, Brian Leftow, Nicholas Wolterstorff, and Charles Taliaferro.

The Introduction and Part I together occupy nearly half the book and treat the topics of (i) Jesus' self-understanding (Evans), (ii) the way in which the Christian gospels represent a kind of developmental regression in comparison with Old Testament wisdom literature with respect to views about divine grace and knowability (Crenshaw), (iii) four different ways of viewing Jesus as he is portrayed in the gospels, and the relevance of those ways to philosophy (Johnson), and (iv) Pauline attitudes toward philosophy and "human wisdom" (Gooch).

One would have expected from the title of Part I that the essays therein would deal with Jesus' relation to First Century thought. In fact, however, they mostly do not. Evans's essay addresses Jesus' understanding of himself, but says very little about his own "thought context". (Moreover, it largely just repeats in abbreviated form, and with strikingly little argument, views that he has presented in fuller detail elsewhere.) Crenshaw's is primarily about wisdom literature written prior to the First Century, with Jesus making an appearance only on the last two pages of the essay. Johnson's essay is fundamentally about Jesus, but focuses mainly on Jesus' relation to philosophy in general rather than on anything having to do with First Century thought. Gooch's essay is primarily about Paul. Of course, Part I might simply have been mislabeled. But what's more surprising is that, Johnson's essay aside, none of these essays seem clearly to have anything to do with the volume's fundamental, motivating question -- namely, what the relevance of Jesus to philosophy is.

Part II consists of two essays, one on Augustine, the other on Aquinas. In light of all of the explicitly Christian philosophy done in the medieval period, it is surprising that nearly half of the book is devoted to the Introduction and Part I and only two chapters comprising forty pages to Part II. Still, both essays contain interesting material.

In "Jesus and Augustine," Gareth Matthews argues for two points of contact between Jesus and the philosophy of Augustine. First, Jesus is said (in The Teacher) to be a sort of "Inner Sage" who dwells within us and facilitates our understanding of language and other matters. Second, Jesus' injunctions to eschew not just murder and adultery (say), but the corresponding inner attitudes of hatred and lust as well, serve as the inspiration for Augustine's view that "it is not the 'outer' actions [of a person] that are the primary object of moral assessment [but rather] the 'inner' activities of suggestion and pleasure in the forbidden, as well as the inner action of forming the intention to perform some forbidden action". (119) For those interested in ascertaining Jesus' relevance to philosophy as such, the first point here is clearly the more pertinent one for it implies that Jesus himself might actually play a very direct role in the doing of philosophy by individual believers. But the practical import of this suggestion (if any) for contemporary philosophers is left unexplored.

For Augustine, then (according to Matthews), Jesus is a guide to the goals of philosophy. For Aquinas (according to Leftow), on the other hand, Jesus and his teachings are among the goals. Jesus claimed to be "the way, the truth, and the life." Thus, for Aquinas, insofar as philosophy aims at knowledge of the truth, it aims at knowledge of Jesus and his teachings. Such knowledge, then, is an "unacknowledged goal" of all philosophy -- or, at any rate, an "unacknowledged indispensable route" to philosophy's goals. (128) Relatedly, according to Leftow, the teachings of Jesus play for Aquinas a constraining role in his philosophy: they provide data for Thomistic philosophy in much the way that scientific theories provide data for contemporary naturalistic philosophy. These metaphilosophical points are sketched early in Leftow's essay, the remainder of which is devoted to what might be thought of as an extended illustration of the claim that Christ's teachings play a constraining role in Thomistic philosophy -- a discussion of ways in which Thomas's Christianity shaped his appropriation of Aristotle's views about divine knowledge.

The extended illustration is only that, however. In other words, there is no real exploration of the practical import of the metaphilosophical points; nor is there much discussion of whether or why we should endorse them. This is unfortunate. It would seem that if Leftow's Aquinas is right about philosophical methodology, then it is a mistake to do philosophy in a religiously neutral way or in a naturalistic way. For both ways of doing philosophy will leave out crucial data -- namely, the data revealed by the Christian faith. The anti-naturalism is obviously at odds with what many contemporary philosophers take to be correct philosophical methodology. But even Christian philosophers have opposed the "anti-neutralism". One wonders, then, whether one might find arguments in Aquinas that bear on these controversies. One might also wonder whether we can discern in Aquinas (or tease out of reflection on Aquinas's practice) principles about what to do when, say, reason and Christian revelation seem to clash, or principles about how to distinguish the 'raw data' of revelation from interpretations that might already embody a certain degree of philosophical theorizing, and so on. But these issues are generally left aside.

That said, I should also note that, taken as stand-alone essays, both of the papers in Part II are well-done and enjoyable. My concern, rather, is that they give short shrift to precisely those topics that seem most pertinent to the anthology's central motivating question. It is thus a concern about emphasis in the given context, rather than about content as such -- and it is one that applies more or less to the volume as a whole, not just to these two essays.

Part III covers the topics of "the epistemology of Jesus" (Abraham), Paul Ricouer (Ford), forgiveness (Wolterstorff), and the meaning of life (Taliaferro). The editor's introduction tells us nothing about what principle (if any) guided or unifies this selection of topics. Why epistemology but not metaphysics, for example? Why forgiveness but not faith, grace, love, or friendship? Why an essay on Ricouer in particular but not an essay on, say, Jesus and contemporary analytic philosophy of religion? The answers to these questions aren't clear.

Be that is it may, Part III does contain what, in my opinion, is the highlight of the volume -- Wolterstorff's essay on forgiveness. In that essay, Wolterstorff argues for two conclusions: First, Jesus' injunctions to forgive others were not so much a product of his religious message as of his rejection of the 'reciprocity code,' according to which it is appropriate to repay evil with retribution. Second, the importance of forgiveness as a component of our contemporary moral culture has its origin in the words and deeds of Jesus. Along the way, he also offers remarks about the nature of forgiveness. On his view, to forgive one's offender is to forego any sort of retribution and also to forego one's anger towards the offender, but without forgetting the offense. On his view, Jesus called his disciples to forego retribution in any case and always to seek the good of one's offenders. But, he thinks, foregoing one's anger without forgetting the offense is possible only if the offender repents, thus distancing or dissociating herself from the wrong done, or was never culpable for the act in the first place. Thus, absent repentance, genuine forgiveness of a culpable offender is impossible. (205) We can, nevertheless, seek the good of such a person; and this, he thinks, is what Jesus was primarily urging his followers to do when he encouraged them to do such things as "turn the other cheek" or "go an extra mile".

Wolterstorff's discussion is rich and repays close attention. But it also raises questions. For example: It is hard to imagine it being a good thing (morally or rationally) to cultivate a disposition simply to forget wrongs that have been done to one. But it is also hard to imagine maintaining anger toward someone whose good one is consistently seeking: seeking someone's good rather naturally leads to the dissipation of anger, regardless of whether the person repents of her sins, and regardless of whether we later come to think that she wasn't culpable. Often the anger just goes away. But in actively seeking someone's good, we might also acquire reasons that help us to put it aside. We may come to understand her better; we may see ways in which her behavior towards us flows out of brokenness and pain rather than malice; we might even come to think that we would have behaved in similarly wrong ways or worse in her circumstances. Most of the time these and similar realizations will not lead us to believe that the offender wasn't culpable for her offense; but they might nevertheless lead us quite naturally to forego our anger towards her. Now, we might suppose that, in all of these cases where our anger naturally dissipates as a result of seeking someone's good, we are simply forgetting the offenses (or the wrongness thereof) that have been committed against us. But if so, then it looks as if following Jesus' injunction to seek the good of our enemies leads us to cultivate dispositions that aren't good for us to have. If not, then, contrary to what Wolterstorff argues, there are ways of foregoing our anger toward someone that do not require or involve our forgetting or her distancing or dissociating herself from the action. But if that is right, then why not think that Jesus was enjoining his followers to do those things as well?

Let me close with a few remarks about the volume's introduction. The most striking feature of the introduction is the "advice" to Christian philosophers implied in Moser's view about the relationship between Jesus and philosophy. More than any of the contributors to the volume, Moser confronts head-on the question of Jesus' relevance to philosophy. He writes:

How, then, is Jesus relevant to philosophy as a discipline? Philosophy in its normal mode, without being receptive to an authoritative divine challenge stemming from divine love commands, leaves humans in a discussion mode, short of an obedience mode under divine authority… . Hence, the questions of philosophy are, notoriously, perennial. As divinely appointed Lord, in contrast, Jesus commands humans to move, for their own good, to an obedience mode of existence relative to divine love commands… . Accordingly, humans need to transcend a normal discussion mode, and thus philosophical discussion itself, to face with sincerity the personal … Philosophical discussion becomes advisable and permissible, under the divine love commands, if and only if it genuinely honors those commands by sincere compliance with them. (17)

What does it mean, exactly, for philosophical discussion genuinely to honor "divine love commands"? Moser doesn't say with any precision; but we get a sense of what he has in mind from the following remark:

Even if a philosophical pursuit is truth-seeking, including seeking after truths about God and divine love, it could run afoul of the divine love commands. It could advance a philosophical concern, even a truth-seeking philosophical concern, at the expense of eagerly serving God and one's neighbor. For instance, I could eagerly pursue an intriguing, if esoteric, metaphysical truth in ways that disregard eager service toward God and my neighbor. (16)

Thus, it looks as if Moser thinks that Jesus' relevance to philosophy boils down to this: In light of Jesus' commands to love God and our neighbor, to the extent that doing philosophy keeps us from "eagerly" serving God and our neighbor, it runs "afoul of the divine love commands" and is not permissible. If this is right, then we philosophers need to take a cold, hard look at what we do every day to put dinner on our tables, and we need to stop it, unless we can find some way in which talking philosophy with colleagues and graduate students, attending departmental colloquia and conferences, writing papers about metaphysics and epistemology, and the like either constitute eager service toward God and our neighbors or simply fill time that could not sensibly be used in such service. (I assume that the fact that doing philosophy puts dinner on our tables isn't sufficient to make everything we do for our jobs count as "eager service" towards God or our neighbor. If it is, then Moser's advice has no real bite.)

So far as I can tell, the only argument Moser offers in support of the advice quoted above is the following:

We humans … have limited resources, in terms of time and energy for pursuing our projects. We thus must choose how to spend our time and energy in ways that pursue some projects and exclude others. If I eagerly choose projects that exclude my eagerly serving the life-sustaining needs of my neighbor (when I could have undertaken the latter), I thereby fail to love my neighbor. I also thereby fail to obey God's command … to give priority to my eagerly serving the life-sustaining needs of my neighbor. (15; emphasis in original)

There is much to object to in this little passage. But the main thing I want to point out here is just this: It is very difficult to see how editing or contributing to a volume like Jesus and Philosophy serves the life-sustaining needs of anyone. It is, moreover, quite easy to see how time spent on such a project excludes a wide variety of activities -- helping out at the local soup-kitchen, for example -- that very obviously serve the life-sustaining needs of our neighbors. Thus, if we are to see this passage as sincerely written, it seems that we cannot take it straight up. We must assume that, whatever the passage is saying, its author isn't, in the very act of composing it, ironically accusing himself of doing something morally impermissible. Thus we must fill in appropriate qualifications, nuance our understanding of terms like 'life-sustaining' and 'needs', attend to differences among equally viable ways of describing the same project, and so on. But once we have done all of this, I have no idea what we will be left with. In short, if we take it at face value we can't take it seriously; but unless we take it at face value, there is no reason to think that it supports the austere advice quoted earlier.