John Buridan: Portrait of a Fourteenth-Century Arts Master

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Zupko, Jack, John Buridan: Portrait of a Fourteenth-Century Arts Master, University of Notre Dame Press, 2003, 550pp, $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 026832564.

Reviewed by Sten Ebbesen, Institute for Greek and Latin, Denmark


John Buridan died about 1360 after having taught philosophy at the university of Paris for more than three decades, during which he managed to lecture on almost all parts of Aristotle’s philosophical corpus, in several cases twice or even three times. He was a first-rate philosopher, who in his writings hardly ever contradicts himself, whether because he had got it all right from the beginning or because he lived long enough to revise and harmonize what he had written. He was the founding father of a continental nominalism, and for a century and a half he was to exert an immense influence on the way philosophy was taught in many universities. Like many other great scholastic thinkers he was then almost forgotten for a long, long time. During the last thirty years or so interest in his philosophy has returned, however, and a goodly number of studies and editions have appeared, and even an English translation of his chef-d’oeuvre, the Summulae, a bulky introduction to logic. Now Jack Zupko of Emory University has provided the first monograph ever that tries to cover all parts of Buridan’s oeuvre, at least those that exist in printed editions.

Zupko repeatedly underlines the importance of seeing Buridan’s works not just as works of philosophy but as works produced in connection with the teaching of philosophy. Accordingly he mimics a medieval order of reading, dividing his book into two parts of approximately the same length, called “Method” and “Practice”, respectively. For the Method part Buridan himself provided a clear structure. After some general remarks about language and logic in Buridan, Zupko simply takes the reader through the Summulae treatise by treatise. The length of Part One is justified by the importance scholastics, including Buridan, placed on the study of logic. Part Two is somewhat less coherent, consisting of the chapters “Ultimate Questions” (metaphysics, problem of universals), “Bodies and Souls”, “Knowledge”, “Natural Science”, “Virtue”, “Freedom” and “Buridan’s Legacy.” In these chapters Zupko mainly builds on Buridan’s quaestiones on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, De anima, Physics and Ethics, and he really manages to cover a lot of territory.

Zupko’s book combines breadth with detailed analysis of the sources. He sometimes offers well-formulated conclusions that, whether or not they convince the reader, are sure to make him reflect, as when we are told that “Buridan and Oresme … virtually assimilate psychology to physics, looking to their analyses of the motion of inanimate bodies for the right model to explain thinking. Indeed, if we were to formulate a slogan to capture their view of intellectual cognition, it would be ’thinking is like moving’ “ (p.226). Zupko has read his Buridan carefully and his general knowledge of medieval philosophy often helps to put discussions and pieces of doctrine in a narrower or broader historical context, whichever is needed at the moment. The book gives readers unfamiliar with Buridan a chance to glimpse the richness of his philosophical production.

This being said, there are of course features of the book that I am not totally happy with, and to them I will now turn. The most important is a tendency to make Buridan less radical than I think he was in his fight to attain consistency in his philosophy with all its sub-theories.

Judging by his chapter 1, Zupko has little love for genuine grammarians’ and logicians’ yearning to construct formal systems, and apparently finds a more pragmatic approach to concrete utterances more appealing. He also seems to think that it is a good thing not to distinguish too clearly between logic and grammar. While not imputing to Buridan any inability to distinguish between the two disciplines, he tries to persuade us that in his logic Buridan produced a pedagogically good mix of the two by repeatedly appealing to grammatical terminology and doctrine. As I see it, there is no interesting mixture. This is how I read two passages discussed by Zupko: (1)When introducing a term like suppositum Buridan does what just about every logician had done for more than a century: tell the pupils that they must not confuse the logical sense of the word (“what a word stands for”) with the better-known grammatical sense (what nowadays is called the “subject” of a verb). (2) When discussing the various types of subject-term a logician must reckon with, he first has to take up a grammatical point, namely whether a sentence of the type albus currit is at all grammatically well-formed, for if not, the logician need not worry about it. The division between logic and grammar is razor-sharp. Buridan does not go out of his way to bring in a reference to grammar, but he has to mention the grammatical problem in a work of logic exactly to avoid confusion of the two disciplines.

Zupko finds that Buridan very often takes a conciliatory line on contested issues, and sometimes links this fact to his author’s pedagogical concerns. He may well be right in some cases, but I feel his Buridan becomes too tame. An egregious instance of taming Buridan occurs in the discussion of his views about the way the human soul is related to the body. To most readers it would appear that Buridan says that (1) there are some philosophical virtues in Averroes’ view that humans do not have individual intellects but have access to the same incorruptible supra-human intellect; whereas (2) the philosophically soundest position is that of Alexander of Aphrodisias according to whom the human soul is an ordinary form of a material being, just like animal souls, and so corruptible; and (3) there is no philosophical virtue in current church doctrine which requires the soul to be individual and present in the individual matter while also being incorruptible. Buridan bows, of course, to church doctrine, but does not mince words when making clear that only the faith that makes him believe in miracles causes him to support a theory which it would take a miracle for anyone to understand. In Zupko’s interpretation all the sharp edges disappear: “Buridan is not suggesting here that the inherence of the human soul is utterly inexplicable, only that it cannot be explained naturalistically … Similarly, his conception of the miraculous is not absolute, but relative to the epistemic situation of human beings” (pp. 180-81). I cannot deny this, but that Buridan should profess a belief in a God capable of performing miracles, including that of changing the epistemic situation of humans, is a matter of course, given the times he lived in. What was not quite as much a matter of course was that he should profess this belief in the given context and say as sharply as he did that only supernatural intervention could render the official doctrine about the soul intelligible.

Zupko allows his reader to get a good impression of the way Buridan discussed philosophical questions. Instead of just reconstructing the main line of argumentation in the source texts, he repeatedly presents paraphrases and direct quotations of the sources. Unfortunately, this laudable procedure can make it difficult to follow the argumentation, in particular since the English paraphrases often stay very close to the Latin paraphrased, and direct translations tend to be fairly literal. Readers with enough Latin would prefer to read the original text of the quotations, and generally this is possible by consulting the notes, but it is not easy because all notes are gathered at the end of the book. Publishers sometimes think the apparatus of learning should be thus hidden in order not to scare readers away, but it is hard to imagine a potential reader of a book like the present who would be frightened by the appearance of footnotes.

While generally reliable, the translations, most of which are due to Zupko himself, contain some minor errors or infelicities, as two examples will show. At the top of p. 19, for “we must construe these words in the senses in which they have been imposed” read “we must take these words in the senses in which they stand.” The Latin text in footnote 59, p. 289, has “debemus eos [i.e. sermones Bibliae vel Evangeliorum] recipere secundum illos sensus secundum quos positi sunt”. Using ’construe’ for ’recipere’ is idiomatically correct modern English, but the word is not a good choice because in scholastic texts ’construere’ is a technical term of grammar. As for ’imposed’, this term refers to laying down the meaning of a word, but the text’s ’positi sunt’ has no such reference; it simply means ’stand’ or ’are employed [in the text]’. On p. 66 Peter of Spain is said to describe accidental supposition as taking a common term “for those things for which it needs something adjoined to it”; the Latin reads “Accidentalis autem suppositio est acceptio termini communis pro eis pro quibus exigit adiunctum”, i.e. “Accidental supposition is taking a common term for the things that some adjoined word or phrase requires”, ’adiunctum’ being a terminus technicus for an attributive or predicative expression with which a term is construed.

Latin in the main text does not always come out right. Usually the consequences are negligible, as when a teacher is called doctus instead of doctor on p. 42, but it may make someone perplexed to hear that the noun-phrase representing the total significate – the complexe significabile – of the proposition ’homo est animal’ (’Man is an animal’) is homo esse animal. Fortunately, though, a correct English translation (’man being an animal’) accompanies the bad Latin, which should have been hominem esse animal.

The way the book puts Buridan’s work in a historical perspective is not always convincing. Buridan was very well acquainted with the philosophically most important writings of Thomas Aquinas, whom he clearly respected, and thus it is obviously relevant when Zupko on several occasions compares Buridan’s views with Thomas’. It is less obvious, however, why Abelard should be given a prominent role in a sub-chapter on “Universals as mereological wholes” (pp. 150-163), which contains the claim that “if Abelard gives the rudiments of a formal approach to part/whole discourse, Buridan can be seen as perfecting it” (p. 156). Likewise it is not obvious why a discussion of Buridan’s views about the relationship between grammar and logic should first contrast Abelard and the 12th-century grammarian Petrus Helias, and then present Buridan, justifying the procedure by saying that “we can think of Buridan’s conception of the relation of logic and grammar as striking a balance between the opposing perspectives of Abelard and Helias” (p. 12).

The problem with the procedure is that in spite of the cautious “can be seen” and “we can think of”, the reader is left with the impression of Buridan as a continuator of Abelard’s work. But two hundred years separated them, and Abelard had not achieved the status of a classic, so Buridan is most unlikely ever to have read any Abelard whatsoever. If any of the latter’s view exercised an influence on Buridan, this was through a lot of middle-men. Having recourse to Abelard reflects a modern history-of-philosophy course centered on a few great men --– Abelard, Thomas, Scotus &c. -– while neglecting the men that were Buridan’s direct predecessors: the arts masters of the late 13th and early 14th centuries.

Buridan must have known Petrus Helias, but quite possibly the acquaintance was superficial, and even if Zupko were right in taking P. Helias’ remarks about etymology to imply that there is a natural link between the phonetic shape of a word and its meaning, it would be misleading to use him to found the claim that “in grammar the material forms of words and what they signify was thought to be natural” (p. 24). This was certainly not the view of university grammarians in the generations immediately preceding Buridan’s, though they did admit that in exercising their free choice of phonetic matter to express their thoughts the inventors of words did not, in general, choose at random. This is why etymology is possible. There is no natural reason why a stone should be called ’lapidem’ in Latin, but by choosing that expression the inventor of the word built into it a reference to one of the properties of a stone, namely that it hurts one’s foot (laedit pedem).

Peter Helias gets much more than he deserves in a book about Buridan. We are invited (p. 9) to see him as the inventor of the summa and to see the relationship between his Summa super Priscianum and Priscian’s Institutiones replicated in the relationship between Buridan’s Summulae and Peter of Spain’s. But quite apart from the dubious nature of the claim about Peter Helias’ invention, the similarity is rather superficial. Helias provides a bulky commentary on a bulky authoritative text that nobody could ever memorize in its entirety. Buridan takes Peter of Spain’s introduction to logic, a very concise text, revises it thoroughly, cuts it into appropriate parts and provides each with a commentary. The result is a book that could be used as follows: the pupils memorize the basic text that summarizes logical doctrine in rather traditional terms, but they learn to interpret it in Buridan’s own – and sometimes revolutionary – way. Later recalling the memorized text the student may then be expected to be able to reconstruct the correct interpretation even if he may not remember all of Buridan’s explanatory remarks. The history of summulae that could be memorized while being taught with explanatory commentary goes back to the twelfth century, but certainly not to Peter Helias’ commentary on Priscian. Incidentally, there is a misleading piece of information on p. 47, where it is stated that treatises I-V of Peter of Spain are based on texts of the logica vetus, while VI-XII derive from various twelfth-century treatises on the properties of terms. In fact, treatise VII, more than a third of the whole work, is related to Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi in the same way that I-V are related to texts of the ars vetus.

Little research has been done on the products of the Parisian arts faculty in the years during which Buridan received his training, so it can be difficult to reconstruct the background against which he acted. On the other hand, so much work has gone into researching the faculty’s production in the late 13th century that a much more plausible reconstruction of his backdrop is possible than one that is based on 12th-century sources. Now, Zupko does in fact refer to the late-13th c. type of grammatical theory that we call “modism”, and argues (pp.39-40) that Buridan rejected it because it posits a non-existing isomorphism between modes of signifying, understanding, and being that would allow one to conclude that if ’Peter’s purse’ implies that the purse is Peter’s possession, then ’the city’s sovereign’ is the city’s possession. In fact, however, Buridan’s objections against naïve inferences from linguistic form to reality were entirely traditional, used also by modists, and posed no threat at all to their theory, which only claimed that the formal elements (modes of signifying) of language have a basis in reality, not that all words have been equipped with the right sort of markers so that a simple inspection of a word’s grammatical type would tell you the true properties of whatever it signifies. In the passages adduced by Zupko, Buridan simply is not polemicizing against modism.

With the above caveats, I recommend reading Zupko’s book.