John Rawls: His Life and Theory of Justice

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Thomas Pogge, John Rawls: His Life and Theory of Justice, Michelle Kosch (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2007, 228pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195136373.

Reviewed by Arthur Kuflik, University of Vermont


Part I: Basic Exposition and Evaluation

Thomas Pogge's John Rawls: His Life and Theory of Justice begins with a unique, superbly written biographical essay, poignantly recounting many of Rawls's most personal (and least well-known) experiences. We learn, for example, that two of Rawls's younger brothers died in childhood, each from a serious infection that had first afflicted Jack but from which he alone managed to recover. Such events would likely have a significant effect on a young child and indeed Rawls's mother believed that the first of these two tragedies triggered the stammer which was a "serious (though gradually receding) handicap" for Jack "for the rest of his life" (p. 5). We are offered a remarkable glimpse into Rawls's transformation away from orthodox religion (though never, it would appear, from religious-like concerns with the ultimate significance of human life, the nature of evil, and so forth). Drawing from Rawls's unpublished essay entitled "On My Religion", Pogge reveals how Jack had once considered attending a theological seminary and entering the clergy but was eventually moved -- by two personal incidents as a soldier in the Pacific during WWII and by reflection on the Holocaust in Europe -- to "an increasing rejection of many of the main doctrines of Christianity" which, in Rawls's own words, became "more and more alien to me" (p. 14).

The introductory chapter also includes a summation of Rawls's intellectual development -- from his dissertation and early essays ("Outline of a Decision Procedure for Ethics", "Two Concepts of Rules", "Justice as Fairness") to three of his major tomes, A Theory of Justice (TJ); Political Liberalism (PL) and Justice as Fairness: A Restatement (JFR). A fourth work, The Law of Peoples, is duly mentioned as Rawls's contribution to the theory of just international relations but is neither expounded nor criticized -- tasks that Pogge has undertaken extensively elsewhere (cf. his articles "An Egalitarian Law of Peoples" and "Rawls on International Justice" as well as his book, World Poverty and Human Rights). In these pages, we discover who were the most significant influences on Rawls's own thinking as he evolved from undergraduate (W.T. Stace, Norman Malcolm) to graduate student and faculty member (J.O. Urmson, H.L.A. Hart, William Baumol, Frank Knight, Burton Dreben). It is interesting to learn how even in the earliest days of his philosophical career, Rawls was already exploring the possibility of deriving "substantive results" from a purely hypothetical deliberation decision-procedure. In contrast with the eventual design of the "original position", Rawls's first attempt at devising such a procedure had the "participants" deliberating "independently of one another" and forwarding their proposals for moral principles to "an umpire" (p. 17).

Rawls was not only a philosophical theorist but also a morally concerned citizen, and so this biographical chapter recounts a few of the ways in which he entered into policy debate. Rawls publicly opposed the Vietnam War but also condemned as unjust the deferments for students and graduate students which were available during that era. Given his deep concern with achieving the "fair value" of the political rights, Rawls explicitly criticized the Supreme Court decision in Buckley v. Valeo, which ruled that certain kinds of limits on campaign financing are unconstitutional infringements on freedom of expression. Not mentioned in this text but perhaps worth noting is the way in which Rawls developed his criticism, not only by appeal to ideas drawn from his own theory of justice, but from the perspective of the U.S. Constitution and previous Supreme Court decisions as well. Another involvement in public policy issues that might have been referenced was Rawls's willingness, late in his own life, to join with Ronald Dworkin, Thomas Nagel, Thomas M. Scanlon and Judith Thomson in signing the "Philosophers' Brief" -- the amici curiae document submitted in 1997 to the Supreme Court on behalf of the proposition that terminally ill persons ought to be recognized as having a Constitutionally protected right to physician-assisted suicide.

Pogge's in-depth philosophical exploration of Rawls's ideas begins with a sketch of the methodology Rawls called "wide reflective equilibrium" and an explanation of why Rawls's focus is primarily upon "practices" or institutions and in particular the "basic structure" of (political) society. In the course of Chapters Two through Eight, we find careful and often remarkably detailed expositions of virtually all the major themes in Rawls's theory of justice including (but not limited to): why Rawls's liberalism should be understood as a political conception of justice to be distinguished from more "comprehensive doctrines"; how persons holding to otherwise divergent comprehensive doctrines might nevertheless form an overlapping consensus in support of a political conception of liberal justice; why an overlapping consensus of the sort Rawls seeks is not to be confused with a mere modus vivendi; the nature of the hypothetical deliberation-procedure Rawls dubbed the "original position" and the considerations that might be said to underlie the particular way in which that thought-experiment has been constructed; the difference between an "ideal" and "non-ideal" theory of justice as well as other "simplifying" or idealizing assumptions that Rawls provisionally makes; the two principles of Rawlsian justice themselves; the lexical priority of the first principle over the second principle, and within the second principle, of the "fair equality of opportunity" clause over the "difference" clause; the duty of civility and the ideal of free public reason; the "method of avoidance" which Rawls employs in his effort to construct a suitable "political conception of justice"; and an exposition of how that method bears on various questions about the place of such notions as reasonableness and truth in Rawls's liberal political philosophy.

To round out this impressively detailed and sophisticated discussion, Pogge's ninth and final chapter offers a concise exposition of themes in the libertarian and communitarian critiques of liberal justice along with an insightful exploration of the main points that Rawls does (or Rawlsians might) make in response to those critiques. The book concludes with a brief examination of the question of whether Rawls's theory of justice can be construed as "Kantian" or otherwise significantly linked to important themes in Kant's philosophy.

Overall, this might well rank as the most extensive and philosophically probing exposition of Rawls's political philosophy yet produced. In a brief review, it would be impossible to do justice to Pogge's rich and complex treatment. Of course, as with any serious study of a major philosophical thinker, there will be ample room for readers to learn much from Pogge while taking issue with some of his interpretations, criticisms and constructive suggestions. I will briefly try to identify a few of the book's strengths and one or two respects in which other Rawls scholars might find room to dissent from Pogge's account.

Part II: More Substantive Philosophical Explorations

1. Two developments in Rawls's later work that Pogge clarifies and defends: the appeal to "higher-order interests"; the abstention from debates about moral truth

Pogge notes an important shift in the way Rawls came to characterize the motivation of the parties to the original position. Rawls had originally posited that in deliberating from behind a veil of ignorance, they could only take an interest in those goods (made possible by social cooperation) that it would be rational to want regardless of anything else one might want or value. Thus the parties will try to assure their respective "clients" the best possible distribution of the (social) primary goods. Later however, Rawls would re-describe the parties to the original position as motivated by certain "higher-order interests" associated with the development and exercise of the "two moral powers" --  the capacity for a sense of justice and the capacity for a conception of the good. There are three such interests -- (i) the interest in developing a sense of how "to govern one's conduct in accordance with a shared public conception of justice"; (ii) the interest in being able "to form, to revise and rationally to pursue a conception of the good"; (iii) "the interest in being successful in terms of the particular conception of the good one has chosen" (p. 55). Pogge then introduces an important challenge. To the extent that "these postulated interests" are "remote from" what most people seem to care about, how can Rawls justify his reliance on a deliberation-procedure which places so much emphasis upon them?

In a philosophically fascinating discussion, Pogge defends the idea that these "higher-order interests" provide a more suitable basis for evaluating "alternative ways of organizing" political society than the more familiar notion of "happiness". To begin with, not everybody values happiness; some even sacrifice it for other goals. But more importantly, it is difficult to get agreement either on what happiness is or on how to accomplish "its interpersonal aggregation". By the same token, however, few people have thought explicitly about the three "higher order interests". Is it then "unfair for Rawls to base his conception of justice exclusively on three 'fundamental' interests that mean little to most people?" (p. 55). Pogge explores several different moves that Rawls does or could make in response to this challenge and why, upon careful reflection, people could and would come to appreciate the deeper significance of these three interests: e.g., that self-respect "presupposes the development and exercise of the two moral powers"; that nearly everyone does have the third of these three interests -- an interest in successfully realizing chosen ends -- and the other two "higher order" interests can be appreciated as "constituent parts" of that interest or "means to its fulfillment"; that in a pluralistic society, individuals whose more particular interests are widely divergent can nevertheless recognize these higher-order interests as providing sufficient common ground on which to work out the terms of their political association with one another.

Another development in Rawls's later work that Pogge sets out to clarify and defend has to do with the relationship between a liberal political conception of justice and such controversies as to whether moral statements have truth value and/or whether there is an independent moral reality to which sound moral judgments correspond. Rawls believes that in the defense of liberal political justice, it is important to avoid such metaphysical disputes. For Rawls, a liberal political conception of justice is to be understood as a view about the basic political structure of society, not about "the whole of life". Thus Rawls presents his conception of justice in a way that does not rely upon any more "comprehensive" view of life's ultimate meaning, value and purpose or upon any particular metaphysical or meta-ethical view about the ultimate nature and status of moral judgments. The hope is that persons holding widely divergent views on such matters can nevertheless converge in their appreciation for liberal constitutional democracy, albeit each from his or her own more distinctive, and sometimes more comprehensive, outlook. Of course, citizens are free to have and to express reasons and arguments stemming from their own more comprehensive views. But insofar as they are arguing about "constitutional essentials", i.e., the most fundamental features of the framework within which everyone will be compelled by public political authority to operate, they have a duty of "public civility" to present more "public reasons" as well, i.e., considerations that fellow citizens who do not share their own more "comprehensive" outlook could also reasonably acknowledge.

Pogge addresses the question of whether, contrary to Rawls's aspiration, political liberalism -- with its narrow focus on the basic political structure and its insistence on the duty of civility -- is implicitly relying on the assumption that there is no moral truth. The suggestion is that if one believes there is moral truth then one has much less reason to address others within the limits of public reason or to place the duty of civility over and above the living in that truth and imposing it on others. Pogge suggests two answers that a believer in moral truth who also embraces political liberalism might offer: there is often room for reasonable doubt about whether one has accurately grasped (all of) what the moral truth is; one of the moral truths we do have good reason to acknowledge is that we ought to respect one another by observing the duty of civility and by striving to live up to the ideal of public reason. Pogge contends that the possibility of holding either or both of these views while believing in moral truth shows that Rawls's political liberalism is compatible with (but not uniquely reliant upon) the thesis that moral statements have truth value. Thus Pogge concludes that Rawls's version of liberalism can indeed remain "meta-ethically non-committal".

2. Pogge as critic: the "recipient-oriented" nature of the original position perspective

Pogge's philosophical efforts are by no means directed entirely towards defending Rawls. Much of the discussion is sharply critical as well. A major source of concern for Pogge is the way in which the perspective embodied by Rawls's hypothetical deliberation-procedure is, in his view, "recipient-oriented": the parties to the original position must focus exclusively on how the individual human beings they represent will be affected by the selection of a principle. Amplifying a point once made by Nozick (cf. Pogge, p. 178), Pogge interprets this to mean that the parties can only take an interest in the "distributional profiles" associated with various proposed principles of justice and have no intrinsic concern with the various possible "causal pathways" that would produce those profiles. Pogge summarizes all this by saying that the perspective of the original position is (i) consequentialist, (ii) humanist and (iii) "individualist".  Pogge seems to embrace the second and third of these elements but suggests that Rawls's approach would be improved if it were modified to incorporate an important non-consequentialist insight: harms or burdens authorized or engendered by social institutions should be "weighted more heavily" than (otherwise) comparable harms or burdens that have been insufficiently prevented or ameliorated by such institutions (p. 46). (For a more nuanced discussion see Pogge's "Human Flourishing and Universal Justice" in World Poverty and Human Rights, pp. 41-42.)

Pogge offers two illustrations: (i) Unemployment due to a legal restriction "seems more serious, morally" than unemployment resulting from "poorly designed" economic institutions "even if the hardships" are the same. (ii) Physical abuse is more morally serious when arising from government action than when "due to criminals insufficiently deterred" (ibid.).

This discussion raises some interesting questions: (a) How plausible is the proposed non-consequentialist modification? (b) Indeed, how "non-consequentialist" is it? (c) Are there other important non-consequentialist concerns that ought to be incorporated into a conception of political justice? (d) Is Rawls's approach as reflected in the design of the original position really as "consequentialist" and "recipient-oriented" as Pogge's account suggests? (e) Does Rawls's shift in how the motivation of the parties to the original position is to be represented have any bearing on the relevance or force of the criticism?

(a) How plausible is the suggestion that harms directly caused (and/or "authorized") by social institutions be "weighted more heavily" than harms insufficiently deterred or prevented by such institutions? Insufficiently protective laws and policies can (and sometimes do) result -- not "merely" from ineptitude, inefficiency, lack of resources, etc. -- but from deliberate neglect, racist animus, etc. When the cause of "insufficient deterrence" is of this latter nature, it is difficult to be confident that the harms in question are any less "morally serious" than comparable harms caused by direct government action. Suppose that elements of a population rise up to engage in the mass murder of innocent women, children and elderly persons while government officials consistently look the other way. It would appear that what is happening is a form of genocide and that genocide is so seriously wrong that it hardly matters whether the mass-murder is accomplished by officers of the government or accomplished by others, with government officials standing idly by. Perhaps one could say that in such circumstances, the genocide is indeed the product of a "social institution" but then the line between what happens because of what government does and what happens because of what government refrains from doing begins to blur and/or lose its moral relevance.

(b) It might also be objected that to "weight" harms caused in certain ways more heavily than (otherwise) comparable harms caused in other ways only transforms what might have been a truly non-consequentialist thought into a more sophisticated variety of consequentialism: a maximizing calculus of good minus bad, where the goodness or badness of a state of affairs is understood to be affected by the events that preceded it and helped to bring it about.

In the formulation of his own two principles, Rawls actually makes moves (whether he is entitled to or not by the construction of the original position, is a question to which Pogge calls our attention) that go much further in the direction of building non-consequentialist elements into the theory of justice. Rule of law, democratic participatory process, the fair value of the political rights, the fair equality of opportunity -- these are not merely "weighted more heavily" than other socially worthwhile states of affairs but are actually assigned a strict (or "lexical") ordering.

(c) Pogge's suggestion places weight on the distinction between what happens as a direct result of what institutions do and what happens as a result of what institutions might have done but do not do. But non-consequentialist thinking can be developed in a number of other ways as well. For example, a non-consequentialist may insist that certain good outcomes can only be legitimately achieved by going through certain specific procedures; that the protection of certain rights must take (strict) priority over the promotion of certain (otherwise perfectly legitimate) goals or goods; that certain important goods are morally speaking incommensurable with other important goods.

Indeed, several elements of Rawls's own theory of justice do appear to be non-consequentialist in one or more of these ways: in particular, the lexical priority of the basic liberties specified by Rawls's first principle of justice and, within Rawls's second principle of justice, the lexical priority of the fair equality of opportunity requirement over what the "difference principle" clause requires. Pogge seems to have two worries about these elements of Rawls's theory. To be sure he fears that the "recipient-oriented" nature of the original position design doesn't permit Rawls to establish those lexical priorities within the apparatus of his own theory. But Pogge sometimes also seems to be expressing a more general skepticism about having strict or lexical priorities at all. Thus he writes that the lexical priority of the basic liberties principle is "problematic" because it is "assuming that even the smallest superiority in terms of the distribution of basic rights and liberties is more valuable than even the greatest superiority in the distribution of the remaining social primary goods" (p. 79, emphasis added).

This way of formulating the problem is of course very abstract. Missing is any specification of the "causal pathway" by which a slight reduction in the scope of basic liberty rights could assure a great increase in wealth and income. Moreover the "problem" only arises if we can make an assumption that is itself highly problematic: that basic rights, wealth and income can be sensibly reduced to some common-denominator of "value" in light of which a reduction in the scope of basic rights together with a great increase in wealth and income amounts to a "more valuable" overall state of affairs. (The suggestion that it might be rational for people to "trade off" basic civil and political rights in return for greater wealth and income is, in any event, sufficiently controversial to merit more extended discussion.)

(d) Is Rawls's original position perspective as "consequentialist" in character as the "recipient-oriented" critique represents it to be? To be sure, Rawls did write that, "All ethical doctrines worth our attention take consequences into account in judging rightness. One which did not would simply be irrational" (p. 26 in the 1999 edition of TJ; p. 30 in the original 1971 edition). But Rawls also insisted "there is no reason to think that just institutions will maximize the good." The point is that "consequentialism", as usually understood, is both an "aggregative" and a maximizing approach. Caring about what happens to people is not by itself "consequentialist". Thus the parties to the original position are surely concerned with what will happen to the people they represent -- e.g., whether they will be secure in the freedom of their person, live under rule of law, have due process of law, the fair value of political participation rights and the fair equality of economic opportunity. But this hardly proves that from the original position perspective all such elements of a just basic structure must be viewed as mere "causal pathways" lacking any intrinsic significance (either for the parties or for the persons they represent) and/or that the only point in providing for these conditions is to maximize the net sum of good minus bad consequences.

(e) The later Rawls. Whatever its merit in relation to the way Rawls originally constructed his hypothetical thought-experiment, there is room to question the aptness of the "consequentialist" characterization of the original position perspective once the parties to it are re-described as explicitly moved by "higher-order" interests in the development and exercise of their clients' "two moral powers". To illustrate, consider Rawls's own re-formulation of the first principle of justice -- the basic liberties principle. Acknowledging a critique offered by H.L.A. Hart, Rawls ceased to believe that he could make good sense of the idea of a "most extensive scheme of equal basic liberties". In its revised version, therefore, the principle requires a "fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties" (JFR, p. 43), not the putatively "greatest" or "most extensive" such scheme. Of course, this invites the question -- "fully adequate for what?" Rawls's answer is -- "for the development and the full and informed exercise of the two moral powers." (Cf. JFR, p. l12.)

Moreover, in light of this focus on the two moral powers, even the concern with the distribution of wealth and income could be said to take on a different, less "maximizing" orientation. In the opening pages of Political Liberalism there are two passages which support this reading:

(1) First, Rawls tells us that any distinctively liberal conception of justice -- of which his own fully articulated theory is but one special instance -- is to be characterized by

three main features: a specification of certain basic rights, liberties and opportunities … an assignment of special priority to those rights, liberties and opportunities … and third, measures assuring to all citizens adequate all-purpose means to make effective use of their liberties and opportunities. (PL, p. 6, emphasis added; cf. The Law of Peoples, p. 49 for the same three points)

Thus from the perspective of the parties to the revised version of the original position, the primary reason for regulating the production and distribution of wealth and income is to secure for their clients adequate all-purpose means for the informed and effective exercise of their basic liberties and opportunities. Such liberties and opportunities are in turn specified by reference to their higher-order interests, as citizens in political society, in the fully adequate development and exercise of their two moral powers.

(2) The non-consequentialist nature of the perspective provided by the revised version of the original position is perhaps still more strikingly reflected in Rawls's insistence that even the difference principle itself "does not require continual economic growth over generations to maximize upward indefinitely the expectations of the least advantaged" and so is perfectly "compatible with" the "idea of a society in a just stationary state where (real) capital growth is zero" (PL, p. 7, n. 5, emphasis added). Although Rawls did not expand upon this point, perhaps what he had in mind can be reconstructed along the following lines: a society is in a "just stationary state" provided that economic development has proceeded to the point that even those who are least materially well-off are nevertheless assured the material conditions needed for the fully adequate development of their two moral powers and the informed and effective exercise of their basic rights.

As noted earlier, a brief review cannot do justice to all the interesting and important issues raised in this book. But here is one last observation. Rather than question whether various non-consequentialist elements of Rawls's theory would be agreed to from the original position, it might be suggested that Rawls's deployment of such machinery can be criticized from the opposite direction. Thus in refining his description of what motivates the parties to his thought-experiment, perhaps Rawls has successfully tightened up the original position case for his two principles but has thereby rendered the original position apparatus more transparently superfluous. Instead of puzzling over just which agreements would be made by hypothetical deliberators motivated in this or that way, we might set out to make the case for the crucial elements of Rawls's conception of justice more straightforwardly: respect for persons as leaders of their own lives and as free and equal citizens in political society calls for legal, political and economic arrangements that support the fully adequate development and informed exercise of their two moral powers. If the two "moral powers" cannot be justifiably assigned this very special significance, at least for the purpose of working out a theory of political justice, then the apparatus of the original position, which is clearly intended to model such an assignment, will not supply any additional support for the principles of Rawlsian justice.  If, on the other hand, the pre-eminent place assigned to citizens' interests in the development and exercise of their two moral powers can be defended (e.g., in one or more of the ways that Pogge had suggestively explored in his earlier discussion), then the case for the principles of Rawlsian justice can be made directly on that basis, without having to deploy the machinery of the original position or to dispute the outcome of its imaginary participants' hypothetical deliberations.


I am grateful to Oliver Carling for very helpful discussion and commentary.