John Searle's Philosophy of Language: Force, Meaning and Mind

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Savas L. Tsohatzidis (ed.), John Searle's Philosophy of Language: Force, Meaning and Mind, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 297pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521685344.

Reviewed by Jesse R. Steinberg, University of Illinois, Urbana-Champaign


John Searle is most decidedly a philosopher whose estimable contributions to the philosophy of language are well-deserving of a volume dedicated to commentary. Accordingly, John Searle's Philosophy of Language: Force, Meaning and Mind is a welcome contribution that contains a superb collection of original essays on some of his most influential work. The eleven essays are written by preeminent scholars. Some of the essays are critical of Searle's work, while others are supportive and extend Searle's ideas. The book is divided into two main sections -- "From mind to meaning" and "From meaning to force." These two interconnected parts reflect Searle's general approach to the philosophy of language according to which an analysis of meaning would not be adequate if it was not (a) integrated with an analysis of illocutionary force and (b) embedded within a satisfactory account of the mind.

The first essay is by Searle himself and it is as clear and unabashed as anything he has written. He begins with the proclamation that, "The greatest achievements in philosophy over the past one hundred or hundred and twenty-five years have been in the philosophy of language" (15). This might indeed be true. Even if it is not, Searle certainly has made his fair share of contributions to this very important field. This is especially the case with respect to Searle's work on intentionality (in the sense of a mental act or state like a belief being about something). As Searle outlines in his essay, his account of intentionality involves at least three basic ideas. The connection between the two main sections of the book can be quite clearly appreciated after reflecting on these principal theses.

The first central idea regarding intentionality that Searle offers is this: linguistic intentionality does not merely involve the expression of propositions and the existence of conditions under which they might or might not be satisfied, but also requires the association of those propositions with illocutionary forces of various kinds. These illocutionary forces determine the various kinds of speech acts (asserting, promising, marrying, etc.) that language characteristically makes possible. The second idea is that mental intentionality also requires the association of propositions with a variety of kinds of psychological modes. These psychological modes determine the kinds of states (desires, intentions, beliefs, expectations, etc.) that possession of a mind characteristically makes possible. The third and final idea is that linguistic meaning is derived from the communication-driven acquisition of conventional procedures. According to Searle, the satisfaction conditions that mentally entertained propositions have under various psychological modes become the satisfaction conditions that linguistically expressed propositions have under various kinds of illocutionary forces. So, for example, the satisfaction conditions of beliefs become the satisfaction conditions of assertions; the satisfaction conditions of desires become the satisfaction conditions of requests; the satisfaction conditions of intentions become the satisfaction conditions of promises; etc. After cogently summarizing his views, Searle then articulates some of the explanatory advantages of his approach to intentionality.

The next six essays form the part of the collection entitled, "From mind to meaning." The first half of this part is devoted to the foundation of Searle's account of the mind -- his analysis of the intentionality of perceptual experience. François Recanati focuses on Searle's analysis of conscious perceptual states as these involve a condition of causal self-referentiality (which is roughly the requirement that, in cases of veridical perception, what is perceived must be the cause of its own perception). Recanati argues that Searle misconstrues this condition when he assigns it to the propositional content (i.e., what the subject perceives) of the perceptual state. Instead, Recanati contends that it should be seen as a condition of the psychological mode (i.e., the fact that the subject is perceiving rather than, say, yearning or despising).

The following two essays deal with Searle's internalist approach to intentional content. According to Searle and other internalists, the intentional content of perceptual experiences consists entirely of conceptual elements that are produced by the perceiver's mind. In response to this sort of view, many have argued that since perceptual experiences put perceivers in relation to particular objects in the world, an internalist account of intentional content is not acceptable. Searle tried to overcome this objection (what might be dubbed, "particularity objection") with his account of intentional content. He claimed that his account makes room for the particularity of the objects of perceptual experiences because it insists that when a subject perceives a particular object, she not only judges that there is an object there, but also that that object is the cause of the particular experience that she is having. Kent Bach and Robin Jeshion argue in their essays that Searle's defense of internalism fails to remove the force of the particularity objection. Bach and Jeshion have quite different replies to Searle, but the upshot is the same: Searle's internalist account cannot overcome the externalist's particularity objection. As Savas Tsohatzidis eloquently puts it, Bach argues that Searle's account fails because, "the causal self-referentiality condition that he assigns to the content of perceptual states only ensures the particularity of the subject's experience of an object and not the particularity of the object itself" (5). After raising this challenge to Searle's account, Bach offers a possible way out. He suggests that Searle might simply reject an assumption that many externalists seem to make (perhaps oddly, Searle seems to share in this assumption) -- that the only place to account for the particularity of perceived objects is in the content of the perceptual experiences. As I remarked, Jeshion takes a different tack. She offers a priori reasons against taking a purely internalist account of the content of perceptual experience. According to Jeshion, visual-perceptual experience of objects necessarily involves conscious identification of the real-world locations of objects relative to the subject having the experience. If this is correct, then Searle is in trouble (along with other internalists) because it appears that a subject's awareness of an object's relations to those external locations can not be fully specified in wholly internal terms.

Wayne Davis is the author of the next essay. He focuses on Searle's internalist analysis as it applies to the sense and reference of proper names. Davis argues that, with some emendations, Searle's account of proper names not only avoids certain externalist objections, but is clearly preferable to any of the externalist alternatives. Very roughly, Davis argues that Searle's principal claim that the semantically relevant conceptual content of names is descriptively specifiable is mistaken. Davis contends that this commitment prohibits Searle from having an acceptable response to the externalist's objections, but he points out that Searle can avoid this by altering his view slightly. Davis suggests that Searle should instead claim that names conventionally express atomic concepts (because of their atomicness, they cannot be reduced to descriptions of their referents). If Searle were to adopt this new view, Davis claims that he would be able to avoid a number of the challenges that externalists have leveled against him.

The remaining two essays of the first part of the book are concerned with some of Searle's less controversial views. These essays can be seen as making a rather substantial contribution since the authors challenge what are widely held assumptions concerning language and the mind. Christopher Gauker argues that the following assumption (which Searle and many others make) is mistaken: conceptual thought has ontological and explanatory priority over language. According to Gauker, thought processes that are language-independent exist (his example is imagistic processes); and he argues that these thought processes are not conceptual. Gauker holds that conceptual thought is essentially linguistic, and so can neither be supposed to preexist language, nor to contribute to a non-circular explanation of it. Gauker's view is that conceptual thought simply consists in the process of imagining conversations (with the purpose of preparing oneself to solve problems of the same kind as those that are routinely solved by engaging in real conversations).

The next essay has to do with Kripke's interpretation of Wittgenstein and Searle's criticisms of it. According to Kripke's interpretation, Wittgenstein held the view that the practices of communal agreement are constitutive of the contents of an individual's thoughts or utterances. Kripke contended that this sort of view solves a paradox that individualistic accounts of mental and linguistic content like Searle's face.[1] Searle and others have criticized Kripke's interpretation. Searle's arguments in this area are two-fold: (a) he maintains that Kripke's interpretation is not exegetically accurate -- according to Searle, Wittgenstein didn't actually hold the views that Kripke attributes to him, and (b) Searle maintains that Kripke's interpretation does not succeed in solving the paradox in question and so individualistic accounts of mental and linguistic content are not shown to be inferior to Kripke's (and, purportedly, Wittgenstein's) alternative account. Martin Kuch's essay deals with Searle's critique of Kripke's interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kuch argues that Kripke does not misrepresent Wittgenstein's actual views. He also defends Kripke's arguments involving the aforementioned paradox of content, and he concludes that Kripke has a devastating challenge to Searle's individualistic account of mental and linguistic content.

The second part of the book ("From meaning to force") starts with an essay by Kepa Korta and John Perry. They argue that a standard way of conceptualizing propositional content as corresponding to "what is said" in the utterance of a sentence is seriously inadequate. They contend that modifications to this traditional view need to be made. Korta and Perry argue that this view of "what is said" conflates different types of information that are typically capable of being imparted through the utterance of a sentence. The upshot of the essay is that these types of information should be kept separate from each other; and Korta and Perry offer what might be called a multi-propositional conception of propositional content.

The next essay is by Stephen Barker. Barker highlights five central reasons that Searle (and others, including Frege) give for the view that propositional contents are components of meaning of an entirely different nature than the illocutionary forces that apply to them. He argues that these reasons are not compelling in the least, and he goes on to offer a novel account according to which it is assertions (rather than beliefs) that are the primary truth-bearers. According to Barker, an assertion is a speaker's expressive commitment to defend a state of mind which is not truth-apt. He contends that an assertion is true just in case the speaker's hearers expressively commit themselves to defending a type-identical state of mind of their own. (The non-truth-apt mental states in question are defined functionally, according to Barker.) Barker then defends this account against a variety of objections to his view that one need not appeal to classically conceived propositions in order to construct an adequate semantic theory.

Nicholas Asher's contribution to the collection goes a step further than Barker's essay. According to Asher, not only is it the case that one need not appeal to propositions for an adequate semantic theory, but one ought not appeal to propositions when developing a semantic theory. Asher begins by noting that the standard truth-conditional definitions of sentential connectives could be regarded as semantically adequate only if the sentences embedded under them were exclusively declarative. Asher argues that non-declarative sentences (e.g., questions and imperatives) semantically embed under these connectives in ways that make a truth-conditional account of these connectives impossible. He holds that an adequate account of the meaning of sentential connectives must refer to the various illocutionary forces that are constitutive of the distinctive meanings of the various sentence types (and not refer to their allegedly force-independent propositional contents as Searle would have it). According to Asher, we should adopt a dynamic semantical framework -- that represents sentences of all grammatical types as types of action affecting input informational contexts. Asher goes on to construct a novel framework that enables a unified and compositionally precise account of the meaning of sentential connectives that would not be possible if force-independent propositional contents were taken to be the uniquely proper targets of semantic analysis.

The next essay is by the editor of the collection, Savas Tsohatzidis. Tsohatzidis argues against Searle's view that a "yes-no question" and its grammatically corresponding assertion not only have contents that are propositional, but actually have the same propositional content. As Tsohatzidis points out, this thesis is inspired by Frege and is fairly widely endorsed. According to Tsohatzidis, this thesis has seriously unpalatable consequences. He argues that

it leads to an analysis of yes-no questions that cannot be preserved unless by assuming either that inconsistent propositions can have the same content or that the identity of an illocutionary act is simultaneously dependent and not dependent on the proposition to which its force is attached. (13)

Tsohatzidis offers a solution to this problem of analyzing the propositional content of yes-no questions. He suggests that not only does a yes-no question and its grammatically corresponding assertion not have the same propositional content, but that it does not have a propositional content at all. Instead, Tsohatzidis holds that the content is a set of possible illocutionary acts, "whose members are such that if one of them were felicitously performable to the exclusion of others, the question would have been settled" (13).

The final essay of the volume is by Mitchell Green. This essay has to do with the connection that Searle draws between mental and linguistic intentionality. Green mainly focuses on Searle's contention that each kind of illocutionary act is an expression of a particular kind of mental state. Green argues that Searle's account is unacceptable because it interprets the expression of a mental state by an utterance as a conventional property of the utterance. Green's argument against this is that the expression of a mental state is primarily the production of evidence for the existence of that mental state, and since evidential relationships cannot be conventional, Searle's account must be mistaken. Green concludes his essay by developing his own account of how a speaker expresses a mental state via making an utterance that has to do with inferences that hearers make in order to preserve the hypothesis that the speaker is abiding by community norms. So, on his view, a hearer will take an expression made by a speaker as evidence that the speaker has a certain mental state that the community norms set out for utterances of that kind.

In summary, Tsohatzidis has managed to collect essays from many of the major figures working in philosophy of language today. The book provides a lucid account of Searle's work in this area and how it relates to some of the current central debates in the field. Many of the essays are innovative and suggest new ways of approaching Searle's work and its ramifications. I found each essay to be clearly written, thoughtfully argued, and accessible. Although some knowledge of the major developments in philosophy of language is presupposed, one need not be an expert in Searle's work. I have only one reservation. Although there are connections that can be drawn between the various essays, the collection is more a mixture of papers on Searle's work than a unified, concentrated collection on a circumscribed topic. This is, perhaps, a testament to the breadth and depth of Searle's contributions to the philosophy of language. Although this volume would not be recommended as a text for an undergraduate course in philosophy of language, it is quite suitable for a graduate-level seminar on Searle's work on philosophy of language and philosophy of mind.

[1] I hope the reader will forgive me for not spelling out what the paradox is exactly. This review is unfortunately too short to sink one's teeth into the technical and more complicated details of the book.