Joint Attention: Communication and Other Minds -- Issues in Philosophy and Psychology

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Naomi Eilan, Christop Hoerlh, Teresa McCormack and Johannes Roessler (editors), Joint Attention: Communication and Other Minds -- Issues in Philosophy and Psychology, 2005, Oxford University Press, 344pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199245630.

Reviewed by Christopher Mole, Washington University in St. Louis


The guiding insights for our thinking about language learning in the twentieth century were insights into the difficulty of the task that the language-learning infant faces. Chomsky taught us that the grammatical side of language alone is too difficult to be learnt without a bit of help from one's innate endowment. And, as Quine, Wittgenstein, and many others realized, there are also huge difficulties that must be surmounted before the infant can work out what any given word refers to. These difficulties arise because there is always more than one candidate referent whenever a word is uttered, but also, and more fundamentally, because the infant must first realize that the sounds coming out of his mother's mouth are sounds that have referents.

Ingenious thinkers from various disciplines have struggled to produce a theory of how these difficulties are overcome, but it is, in practise, extremely easy for normal infants to pick up the meanings of words, and they seem to have no difficulty at all in realizing that words have meanings. In order to teach the meaning of the word 'radio' to a normal infant of the appropriate age you need only introduce the word in some context where you and the infant are jointly attending to a radio. The form of joint attention that characterises such episodes, and its role in the development of communication, has become a topic of research for several psychologists and philosophers, and a collection of their work, presented at two workshops at the University of Warwick, is now published in Oxford University Press's 'Consciousness and Self-Consciousness' series as Joint Attention: Communication and Other Minds.

The book displays a wide range of approaches to expanding our understanding of joint attention and its role in the development of the infant's understanding of reference. Several of the contributors are concerned with the breakdown of this understanding in autistic children. Some are concerned with the reasons why apes seem to be unable to get beyond the rudiments of such understanding.

Although the methodological approaches that the volume brings together are widely various, its contributors have evidently learned a good deal from one another, and the result displays much more coherence than one might have expected from a book in which philosophy of various sorts shares space with primatology and with discussions of autism. This impressive coherence is heartening to the reader who has entertained fears about philosophy's ability to stay relevant when faced with psychology's unabating torrent of freshly gathered data. The volume provides every reason to suppose that joint attention is a topic on which philosophy and other disciplines can collaborate fruitfully. The book's one paper with interdisciplinary authorship is a clear highlight -- a provocative and sophisticated discussion of joint reminiscing by Christoph Hoerl and Teresa McCormack, both of whom are among the book's editors. Interdisciplinary work is rarely so well accomplished as theirs, and some of the other contributors to this volume can be seen to lose their footing when they move into the territory of neighbouring disciplines. This is a distraction, but is not greatly to the detriment of their contributions: Each achieves something on its own terms, and neither the contributions individually, nor the book as a whole, depends on their interdisciplinarity for their interest.

The philosophical reader will, in fact, find much to be interested by at those points where the various disciplines don't naturally converge. One such clash of approaches arises from the philosopher's desire to see the developing child as responding to reasons and as deploying concepts. This is not just a matter of the philosopher preferring things to look philosophical: He wants the infant's development to look like a piece of reasoning because he wants the resulting beliefs about language and about other minds to count as rational. But, as Jane Heal suggests in her eminently sensible and admittedly speculative essay, the role of joint attention may be distorted by the attempt to understand normal development (and its endpoint) on the model of scientific understanding. Although it may be natural enough for a philosopher to think of infant development on the model of scientific understanding, that way of thinking is clearly not shared by some of the psychologists whose work is represented here, and the psychologists who are most resistant to it -- Peter Hobson and Vasudevi Reddy -- contribute two of the book's most incisive papers. Hobson's work, drawing on extensive and sensitive observation of autistic children, makes the valuable contribution of emphasizing the immediate naturalness (to normal children) of involving others in their engagement with the world, and the emotional importance (to them and to their caregivers) of their doing so. Hobson is at his clearest when recounting the contrasting behaviours of autistic children and non-autistic children, but the clarity of his writing lapses somewhat when attempting to articulate his theoretical stance.

Vasudevi Reddy is concerned with reciprocated attention between child and caregiver, as contrasted with joint attention to a third item. After a rather frenzied critique of existing thinking, she argues for six conclusions concerning the importance of this reciprocated attention in providing the infant with an understanding of attention which is later deployed in episodes of joint attention. All of Reddy's conclusions seem to be important, and all are presented with clear and thorough evidence (although some readers would no doubt have benefited from some explanation when she mentions the 'still-face' and 'double video' procedures). Reddy's astute discussion of clowning and showing-off behaviour exhibits a distinctive and valuable form of insight that is hard to come by when we limit our observation of infants to observations of the presence or absence of responses permitted within controlled laboratory conditions.

Fabia Franco's work, particularly her experiments contrasting imperative and declarative pointing, is also rich with the insights that come from experimental paradigms allowing for the observation of an infant's more naturalistic behaviours. Franco uses a large body of evidence concerning infants' spontaneous pointing behaviours to make the case that infants point with understanding and that their pointing serves to elicit verbal information from social interactions. She is well aware of the difficulties that face any attempt to demonstrate a claim about the presence of understanding, but this does not deter her from being clear throughout that it is understanding she is interested in, and not a watered-down, more readily operationalizable notion. The work that Franco presents here is evidently part of a larger work in progress concerning the use of pointing in adults and children. She has a clear sense of the complexity of the role of pointing in joint attention, and of the fact that focusing our research on the child but neglecting the mother will yield only a partial account of these essentially interpersonal phenomena.

Contrasting with the approach of Reddy and Franco is the less naturalistic approach taken in a paper by Amanda Woodward, which attempts to plot the extent of the infant's conceptual repertoire through a number of preferential looking experiments.

At the heart of the contribution by Johannes Roessler, the volume's fourth editor, is the need to strike a balance between, on the one hand, a portrayal of the infant as rationally acquiring an understanding of other minds, and, on the other hand, the need to avoid a picture of the infant as engaged in implausibly complex reasoning or as deploying excessively complex concepts. Roessler points out a number philosophical problems that are faced by some of the positions one might want to occupy in trying to strike this balance. All of these problems are serious ones, and Roesller presents them in a compelling way. He also wants to claim that the positions that face these problems are sufficiently close to being exhaustive for the problems to amount to a paradox, but here he is less convincing. This is a place at which some of the unappealingly dry philosophical details would have been helpful, and one wishes that Roessler's paper as a whole were more straightforwardly philosophical. After the book's empirically weighted first half, the philosophical beginning of Roessler's paper is welcome and engaging. He begins with questions suggested by remarks from Iris Murdoch's The Sovereignty of Good and from Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, and it is hard for the philosophical reader not to feel a little disappointed when, after two pages of philosophical scene setting, he announces that "Rather than trying to tackle these questions head-on, I will approach them by considering a less purely philosophical […] question that has been the subject of […] developmental psychology." This 'less purely philosophical approach' is not without virtues, but the issue that Roessler is engaging is, ultimately, a philosophical one -- it is the question of how new understanding can be reached. And the problems Roessler poses are close relations of the old and enduring philosophical puzzles that the tortoise set Achilles and that Plato sets us in the Meno. Roessler's positive suggestion about the importance to the infant's development of evaluative attributions, such as attributions of scariness, funniness, and disgustingness, is a promising lead, and it is to be hoped that he pursues it in future work.

The head-on philosophical approach that Roessler avoids is found in papers by John Campbell and Christopher Peacocke. Both are concerned with the relation between joint attention and 'common knowledge' in the technical sense introduced by David Lewis when explaining the rationality of conventional and coordinated behaviour. The virtues of the head-on approach are very much in evidence in Peacocke's contribution, the strength of which is as much owing to his precision in posing a philosophical question as to his technically deft and phenomenologically sensitive way of answering one. The first item on Peacocke's agenda is the giving of an accurate and literal description of the openness of joint attention. This openness is, intuitively, a matter of mutual awareness between joint attenders of what the other is aware of, and one of the things that each joint attender is aware of is the other's awareness. The iterated awareness of one another's awareness is essential to the openness of joint attention, but iterations beget infinity, and care is needed to avoid attributing infinitely complex contents of awareness to finitely minded joint attenders. Peacocke avoids the problem by offering an analysis that uses the notion of the availability of contents for occurrent awareness, together with self-referential awareness of this availability. This is a different way of dealing with the potential problems of infinite iterations from that used in Lewis's discussion of common knowledge (and in Stephen Schiffer's), and Peacocke is clear about why the more familiar tactic cannot be made to work for iterations of awareness and offers some interesting speculation about whether the notion he has introduced might be more fundamental and more widely applicable than common knowledge as Lewis and Schiffer understand it.

John Campbell's essay reproduces the work on joint attention from Chapter Eight of his 2002 book.

At the other end of the book's methodological range is a pair of essays focusing on primates. The first, by Josep Call and Michael Tomasello, presents a nice puzzle that arises from a series of experiments in which chimpanzees show a pattern of competence and incompetence that it is hard to resolve into a coherent picture of their abilities. Call and Tomasello suggest that the apparent conflict can be resolved by crediting chimps with a high degree of know-how that they can deploy in social interaction, while denying that they have an understanding of others as representing the world. The details of this suggestion are rather difficult to understand, which Call and Tomasello admit, suggesting that non-chimps should not expect chimpanzee folk psychology to be any easier to understand than human.

A second paper on the abilities of apes, this one by Juan Carlos Gomez, adds some interesting results with gorillas to the discussion and makes some connections between the chimp's situation and that of the autistic child. It is never entirely clear, however, how Gomez's theoretical approach differs from that of Call and Tomasello. This is in part because his attempts to explain what is meant by 'practical representations' or by 'sensorimotor notion of a subject' are never entirely successful. If, as sometimes seems to be the case, the intention is to claim that apes have something like understanding-constituting know-how for social interactions, then the suggestion is very similar to that of Call and Tomasello. The difficulties of understanding what is meant here come, in part, from an awkward prose style that afflicts much of Gomez's paper. ('Specially' for 'especially' on p. 67, 'blatant' for 'obvious' on p. 68, 'paramount' for 'paradigm' on p. 77: Surely it should have been somebody's job to correct this sort of thing.) The paper is nonetheless a helpful one, especially when illustrating some of the complexities that one faces in interpreting ape behaviour, and in its careful handling of the easily overlooked differences between apes reared with various degrees of human interaction.

Naomi Eilan contributes a chapter that strives to incorporate introductory material alongside more substantive considerations. The chapter may prove to be a useful introduction to those readers who are not put off by Eilan's organization of her material around Donald Davidson's most radical and least plausible proposals about the impossibility of a solitary thinker having thoughts about the mind-independent world. Unfortunately it is a chapter that is poorly executed throughout, in a way that suggests it must have been written in great haste. Typos remain of the sort that the most cursory proof-reading should have detected: Page three has a sentence that begins "Despite the centrality of the those of attention […]". And there is some quite elementary philosophical bungling. On page five we are presented with four conditions as being necessary conditions on joint attention. ("[T]o say of an event that it is an event of two subjects (or more) jointly attending to the same object is to be committed, at least, to the truth of the following four claims about the event.") But no sooner have these conditions been introduced than they are being treated as sufficient for joint attention ("Let us say that when these conditions are met, we have in play a 'joint attention triangle'."). Eilan and the editors with whom she has collaborated on this volume have achieved a work that advances our understanding of joint attention and of the several important phenomena in which it has a role. It is to be hoped that the unappealing introductory chapter does not keep this stimulating book from reaching the wide audience of philosophers and psychologists that it deserves.