Just Life: Bioethics and the Future of Sexual Difference

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Mary C. Rawlinson, Just Life: Bioethics and the Future of Sexual Difference, Columbia University Press, 2016, 296pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231171755.

Reviewed by Catherine Mills, Monash University


Mary Rawlinson's book is more philosophically ambitious than much of what is published in bioethics these days. A respected Irigaray scholar, Rawlinson brings this expertise in theories of sexual difference to bear on debates in bioethics, especially in regards to food ethics, to generate what she calls an "ethics of life." Throughout the book, she develops a strong critique of the rights-based framework of moral and political philosophy, arguing that this is founded on a notion of women's bodies as property. In its stead, she makes a case for reorienting ethical thought around the generativity of women's bodies. The book is organised in four parts, the first of which is dedicated to developing the critical stance in relation to rights-based frameworks. The second part presents the new theoretical framework that Rawlinson wants to endorse, and this is where she most clearly develops the notion of generativity, through an innovative reading of Antigone and the myth of Demeter and Persephone. In the third section, Rawlinson brings her theoretical insights to the topics of the ethics of food and of work. There is also a short concluding chapter in which she urges a move from thinking in terms of sovereignty to solidarity.

In the prefatory material and introductory chapter, Rawlinson sets out a number of theoretical precepts that guide her subsequent analysis, the most significant of which is the idea of the necessity of universals in bioethics. Here Rawlinson is not retreating to abstract universal principles of morality, but argues instead for centralising what she calls "real universals," which are essentially claims about the existential conditions of being human that hold true regardless of culture. She identifies two such real universals: the necessity of eating and the fact that "everyone is born of a woman" (xx). According to Rawlinson, an ethics and politics that gives appropriate weight to such real universals would be characterized by the aim of generativity (understood most specifically as promoting the flourishing of others), interdependency and an "ethics of collaboration focused on building solidarities in the imagination of a new future" (xxi). Thus, the notions of generativity, interdependency and solidarity guide much of the vocabulary of Rawlinson's approach to ethics.

The first part develops a strong critique of rights-based approaches to ethics through a critical reading of Hobbes, Rousseau and Hegel. The central idea is that "the discourse of rights still reflects its origin in the right to property and norms of sexual propriety" (13), and continues to consolidate a view of women as property. One of the more radical implications of this is that rather than protecting women against violence, rights approaches actually underwrite that violence by making women appear as things that can be disposed of at will, rather than as equal moral subjects. This construal of women's bodies as property is further bolstered, in Rawlinson's view, by the integration of biopower (as understood by Michel Foucault) and capital, such that bodies themselves become subject to commercialization and capitalisation. This integration of bodies into capital means that the generativity of women's bodies is seen merely as an opportunity for exploitation and profit-making, rather than as a foundational aspect of ethics.

In order to develop her more positive agenda in opposition to the rights-based approach, Rawlinson begins with rethinking several foundational narratives of Western culture, the idea being that such narratives help to render the contours of philosophical and moral imagination. In particular, she discusses Antigone, and the Greek myth of Demeter and Persephone, in order to give greater focus to the notions of generativity, interdependency and solidarity. Antigone has been much discussed by feminist theorists, who often take lead from the classic reading by Hegel, and understand Antigone as a heroic and transgressive figure, one who foregrounds and troubles the distinction between public and private spheres and the law proper to each, including the law of gender.

Against this view, Rawlinson argues that Antigone is an essentially conservative character. In short, she remains beholden to the paradigm of women as property within the frame of fraternal exchange, complicit in maintaining the public/private distinction, and tied to the patriarchal construal of female agency as a matter of caring for the (male) body, especially through the performance of the burial rite. For Rawlinson, Antigone appears as paradigmatic of a "hardheadedness and hardheartedness [that] oppose life and generativity" (94), and the more promising figure for a feminist ethics, then, is Antigone's sister Ismene. This is because Ismene is primarily marked by a "mobility of person, thought and feeling" (95) that allows her to negotiate among conflicting claims and forge collaborations and, moreover, because she values more highly than anything else "her relations to the living, and particularly the living sister" (100).

While Rawlinson thus highlights relations of sisterly solidarity in the context of generativity, in the myth of Demeter and Persephone what is at issue is the mother-daughter relationship in its opposition to male violence and possession. She uses the mother-daughter couplet in this myth to point to the ethical importance of three things: intergenerational generativity, collaborative agency, and the "continuity of the human body with the natural and elemental world on which it depends" (126).

Not surprisingly, the Demeter myth also contributes to Rawlinson's thinking about food ethics; through it she addresses the 'real universal' that everyone must eat in order to live. Rawlinson claims that women are key drivers of change in relation to practices of eating, with consequences for nutrition, sociality and health more generally. This is because women have historically undertaken the vast majority of the labour involved in food production; this centrality of women, though, is being undermined by the industrialisation of food production in agribusiness, restaurant culture and the fast food industry. The other central point that Rawlinson makes in her critique of current food politics is that matters cannot be reduced to questions of individual choice and liberty, since the choice architectures of eating are overdetermined by agribusiness, global supply chains and marketing. Rawlinson is highly critical of agribusiness for its destruction of biodiversity and the dislocation of eating that it effects. Yet, the images of alternative practices that she provides reduce too easily to a romantic paean to home-cooking and small-hold farming on the one hand, and a Francophilic valorisation of terroir on the other. Yes, eating locally is to be encouraged, but Rawlinson's analysis leaves aside much of the complexity of the ways in which contemporary practices of eating are tied up with broad social, economic and political factors, including but not limited to massive urbanisation, time poverty and labour precarity. Further, for many women, not having to cook (and kill the chicken and make the butter) has been a prerequisite to participation in the public sphere and in other forms of labour -- it has been, at least in a limited way, a liberation.

This is worth commenting on because, in the following chapter, Rawlinson addresses issues of wage precarity more directly, though the connection back to the previous chapter is made only in passing. The more explicit connection that she draws between the two chapters is in terms of ignorance, and particularly the idea that, if only people knew what was involved in agribusiness, or global capitalist exploitation, they would stop eating, wearing or using the products of it. I have doubts about that, and the claim sounds too much like the educationalist 'free choice' paradigm that Rawlinson otherwise opposes. Even so, this is only a small part of her analysis. The bulk of her discussion of issues of work and labour actually focuses on Franklin D. Roosevelt's inauguration speeches, particularly the vision of full employment that he offered. Rawlinson refines this to argue for a world in which the global populace is fully employed in meaningful work, by which she means work that is sufficiently remunerated to sustain a life, is worth doing and experienced as such, is visible and recognized as meaningful by the community and is not demeaning in either the work itself (eg. sex work) or in the structural conditions in which the work takes place (eg. systematic sexism and racism).

Rawlinson's book is imperfectly realized -- some claims made are insufficiently developed, and the connections between claims sometimes remain implicit or obscure. Certain stylistic choices, such as references to Moby Dick throughout, confuse rather than clarify and consolidate. Further, given the claim that "an ethics of life serves the elemental conditions of life and the wild profusion of differentiated beings, as well as the continuities and collaboration between humanbodies and other animals, each one commanding respect" (127), the framework she is suggesting calls out for further engagement with debates in animal ethics. That said, the 'ethics of life' that she proposes that starts from the condition of generativity and the correlates of interdependency and solidarity also adds to feminist ethics in significant ways.

First, her urging of a "critical phenomenology" of ethical life that is open to the possibility of being otherwise and, therefore, enacting ethics differently, brings feminist ethics into contact with the later work of Michel Foucault on ethical self-formation. This connection makes the recognition of generativity central to the formation of livable subjectivities. Moreover, taken together, her arguments lead toward a revaluation of the work of the private sphere, especially of nourishing (in a literal and metaphoric sense) the bodies of oneself and of fellow humans; in this, she moves toward a vision that resists the devaluation of the activity of life itself such as we see in Hannah Arendt's thought, for instance, or Simone de Beauvoir's claim that "home and food are useful for life but do not confer any meaning upon it" (Beauvoir, 2011, 494). In this (and going beyond theorists such as Giorgio Agamben), she opens a way to an ethics of life that is deeply interwoven with feminist concerns about generativity, sexual difference and gender justice.


Beauvoir, Simone de (2011), The Second Sex. Translated by Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier, New York: Vintage.